Proto-Phenomenology and the Nature of Language: Dwelling in Speech I

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Lawrence J. Hatab, Proto-Phenomenology and the Nature of Language: Dwelling in Speech I, Rowman and Littlefield, 2017, 260pp., $42.00 (pbk), ISBN 9781783488193.

Reviewed by Carolyn Culbertson, Florida Gulf Coast University


Lawrence J. Hatab's book is a welcome addition to current philosophical conversations about phenomenology and language alike. In the first half of the book, phenomenology, is the focal point. In the sections entitled "Proto-Phenomenology and the Lived World" and "Disclosure, Interpretation, and Philosophy," Hatab takes his readers through what it means that phenomenology grants priority to the lived world and argues persuasively on behalf of this as a philosophical approach. He argues that philosophy goes astray when it tries to get behind the understanding that we have by virtue of our immersion in the lived, social world, as, for instance, reductive forms of naturalism attempt to do. The topic of language emerges as the focal point only in the second half of the book. In "Proto-Phenomenology and Language" and "Language and Truth," Hatab explains how language exhibits all the elements of the lived world described earlier and how, given this, the question of truth can be treated in a phenomenological analysis. Although readers might expect the topic of language to arise earlier, the way the book develops is actually quite helpful. By carefully going through the argument for the epistemic priority of understanding derived from the lived world, readers are able to better appreciate why scholars like Hatab,[1] Andrew Inkpin,[2] and Charles Taylor[3] choose to take a phenomenological approach to language and why language has played such a central role in phenomenological inquiry.

What will stand out most of all to many readers about the first half of the book is the curious relationship that Hatab's discussion has to the early work of Martin Heidegger. Although there is no entry for any work by Heidegger in his bibliography, Hatab's explanation of the lived world draws extensively from Heidegger's early phenomenological work, and it does so on his own admission. In his preface, for example, Hatab explains that one of his intentions in the book is to highlight what recommends itself about Heidegger's early thinking as opposed to other versions of phenomenology, particularly Husserl's. It is Heidegger's early work specifically that Hatab credits with the development of what he calls "proto-phenomenology," that is, with that "analysis that begins with the everyday world of concerns, involvements, and practices, rather than cognitive structures" (xii). It is not surprising then that throughout the book Hatab introduces several concepts borrowed from Heidegger's Being and Time. What he calls "affective attunement," for example, is his take on what Heidegger called Befindlichkeit. What he calls "intimation" is his rendition of what Heidegger called Verstehen and Umsicht. Yet despite this significant influence, Hatab makes a deliberate effort to carefully curate what he borrows from Heidegger's work, focusing not on its import for questions pertaining to the meaning or history of being, but for questions pertaining to cognition, meaning, social relations, and language. The result is a book that is inviting to readers both familiar and unfamiliar with Heidegger's work.

Having shed some light on what Hatab means by the term "proto-phenomenology" in the book's title, let me now address the subtitle, "Dwelling in Speech," since this points to one of the central claims developed in the second half of the book. For Hatab, language is not just a way of referring to or communicating about things in the world, but plays a more constitutive role in how the world appears to us. He explains that, for example, one hears a door open, not the friction caused by wood rubbing against wood. Even more precisely, one hears their spouse returning home from work or an intruder entering. This understanding is social and linguistic, but it is also the most immediate, basic form that understanding takes. Indeed, Hatab insists, we have the ability to engage the world as meaningful in this way even before we acquire skills of verbalization. This is on account of our capacity for joint attention, which, as he points out, research in child development shows is normally present in human beings from infancy and contemporary neuroscience attributes in part to the mirror neurons that we have from the very start of life. Even as pre-verbal children, then, we begin to adopt a world of meaning that is shared with others.

This has important epistemological implications for Hatab. The way the world is given to us through language, he argues, makes it impossible for philosophers to "get behind it," that is, to understand it outside of social, linguistic meanings. This means that the project of reductive naturalism, which attempts to explain things like love, justice, truth, or ethical responsibility in purely naturalistic terms, inevitably fails, since, as Hatab explains, even the reductive naturalist takes recourse to concepts that have developed over time through language. So, it's language all the way down.

Readers of Heidegger's work will appreciate Hatab's application of Heidegger's early phenomenological analysis to the topic of language, since this connection is underdeveloped in Heidegger. On Heidegger's own admission, the topic of language remained largely in the background of his early work, not becoming a focus for him until his 1934 lecture series on logic.[4] Thus it has been the responsibility of Heidegger's later readers to look back at his early phenomenological writings and to attempt a detailed treatment of language from that basis. Hatab's book is, to my mind, the most successful of these attempts to date.

Yet despite the clear influence of Heidegger's early phenomenology on Hatab's book, readers of the two will no doubt appreciate a couple of significant differences between the projects. First, Hatab takes it upon himself to defend his theory against a number of objections that are commonly raised against the constitutive theory of language. For example, it is common for people to point out that there are situations where one engages the world thoughtfully without any verbalizing, e.g., when watching a dance. For some, this proves that language's role in our thinking is secondary at best. It helps us to clarify things and to communicate about them, but it does not impact how the world is disclosed to us immediately. Hatab clarifies, though, that when he speaks about language as the primary mode of world disclosure, he does not mean language as the verbalization of representational concepts or even their anticipation in the mind. Verbalization, he explains, is certainly a significant part of language for most users, but it is just one piece of the larger phenomenon of language itself, which is, at its core, a shared practice of human dwelling. This is why it is possible to have a language like ASL that has no verbalization at all. Heidegger is not as careful in anticipating such objections.

Second, Heidegger does not speak at all to the different stages a human being goes through when she develops language. Instead, he focuses on the stark difference between the human being, as the one who has language, and all other living creatures. While Hatab too insists on the significance of this difference, he rightly points out the mistake that is made by philosophers who completely ignore the early childhood years during which we start to acquire language. After all, by looking at this period of life, it is easier to recognize the way language acquisition affects how one dwells in the world and develops in conjunction with practical, social forms of knowledge. Thus, unlike Heidegger, Hatab gives plenty of attention to language acquisition in child development and, in fact, will dedicate even more attention to it in the forthcoming second volume.

The integration of empirical research on language acquisition in childhood, just like the integration of research in neuroscience, will seem odd to many readers of Heidegger. However, by highlighting the practical, social activities that provide the context for a child's development of language, Hatab is better able to bring to light the indicative character of language, that is, the way that linguistic concepts "point back to factical experience for their realization" (15). A child learns to say "I love you," for example, as a social ritual that makes up part of the practical activities that, during childhood, they are learning to take part in. They become accustomed to hearing the phrase in moments of tenderness and to reciprocating with those family members who say it to them. To highlight such contexts, then, helps to make the point that we have a tacit understanding of the words we use, and in most contexts, this tacit understanding suffices as reliable.

Now, given his insistence that theory cannot "get behind" language, it is not surprising to hear Hatab acknowledge an affinity between his own phenomenological account of language and the tradition of ordinary language philosophy developed by people like Wittgenstein, J.L. Austin, and Stanley Cavell. The goal of ordinary language philosophy, after all, is to show how our thinking takes its lead from ordinary language practices. This is, in effect, what Hatab himself is doing throughout his book in explaining how the world is disclosed to us primarily through a language that we know, for the most part, prereflectively. Like ordinary language philosophy, too, Hatab hopes that following through with this insight will help dissolve those nagging forms of skepticism that have plagued so many philosophers in the modern era.

Hatab parts ways from ordinary language philosophy on one point that I think is quite important, however. The point of his departure concerns the goal of philosophical investigation. Like deflationary and reductivist schools of thought that see their role as performing a therapeutic correction of philosophical discourse, ordinary language philosophers hope to fix philosophical discourse by removing any questions or concepts that arise from philosophical reflection rather than from a pragmatic social milieu or a form of life. Their tendency is thus to see philosophical reflection beyond a certain point as mere error. Hatab is also concerned with the problems that arise when philosophical discourse strays too far from the lifeworld; however, he avoids chalking this situation up to mere error. Instead, he tries to account for, first, what gives rise to philosophy as a modification of our immersive mode of dwelling and, second, what positive value philosophy adds to the development of an understanding that is rooted in the lifeworld.

Hatab argues that expository forms of thinking, like philosophical discourse, naturally arise out of the immersive activity of factical life. Here Heidegger's influence on Hatab's account is clear. Just as Heidegger argued in Being and Time that Vorhandenheit is a modification of Zuhandenheit,[5] Hatab argues that exposition is a modification of immersion. When one is learning to play music, for example, one will occasionally need to engage in an expositional mode of understanding. This happens, for instance, when one is learning to read sheet music. Similarly, there will be times when one needs to analyze and reflect on some concept of which they have some tacit understanding. This happens, for example, when a disagreement about the meaning of a concept arises in one's society or when one has reason to believe that a concept that they rely upon is unfitting for the phenomenon at hand. In such cases, Hatab admits, philosophical reflection can help us to "dwell on things more carefully, attentively, and perspicuously" (107). In times of exposition and reflection, we are no longer simply immersed in our activity. Yet, Hatab points out that, even in such cases, we engage in exposition temporarily in order to immerse ourselves more effectively -- be it in the social interactions we have with others or in the playing of a musical instrument. This is what it means, for Hatab, that philosophy "emerges from and points back to factical life" (104).

Readers who prefer to think about philosophy as a formal method for dealing with questions of validity may not want to endorse this characterization of the discipline. Indeed, while they should at least appreciate Hatab's effort to articulate a phenomenological conception of truth, some will no doubt be left frustrated with the conception Hatab endorses, according to which truth is determined by five specific truth conditions: responsive fit, reliability, workability, agreement, and consociation (191-2). Such a theory of truth will not give such readers what they are looking for precisely because it is a pluralist conception of truth, whereas what they seek is a formal method by which one can always decide between two or more accounts. On the other hand, readers who are willing to regard truth as an indicative concept in the sense developed throughout his book should find Hatab's treatment of truth, a topic often underdeveloped within existential and hermeneutic phenomenology, helpful and illuminating.

There is much to recommend, then, about Hatab's new book. It is valuable in sketching out what a philosophical treatment of language based on Heidegger's early phenomenology would look like. Moreover, since it makes a compelling case for the value of Heidegger's phenomenological approach both in itself and as an approach to language, it deserves the close attention of anyone interested in language as a philosophic topic. Finally, its clear prose and its engagement with disciplines and concerns typically left out of Heidegger scholarship make it accessible to and engaging for a wide philosophical audience. In this, it does a great service to contemporary Heidegger studies.

[1] Lawrence J. Hatab, "The Point of Language in Heidegger's Thinking: A Call for the Revival of Formal Indication," Gatherings: The Heidegger Circle Annual, Vol. 6 (2016): 1-22.

[2] Andrew Inkpin, Disclosing the World: On the Phenomenology of Language (Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 2016).

[3] Charles Taylor, The Language Animal: The Full Shape of the Human Linguistic Capacity (Cambridge, MA: Belknap Press of Harvard University Press, 2016).

[4] Heidegger describes this in "A Dialogue on Language" in Martin Heidegger, On the Way to Language, trans. Peter Hertz (New York: Harper and Row, 1971), 8.

[5] Martin Heidegger, Being and Time, trans. John Macquarrie and Edward Robinson (New York: Harper and Row, 1962), 101.