Proto-Phenomenology, Language Acquisition, Orality, and Literacy: Dwelling in Speech II

Placeholder book cover

Lawrence J. Hatab, Proto-Phenomenology, Language Acquisition, Orality, and Literacy: Dwelling in Speech II, Rowman & Littlefield, 2020, 312pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781786613981.

Reviewed by Mirela Oliva, University of St. Thomas, Houston


Written with elegance and ease, Lawrence J. Hatab's book argues that language is embedded in the lived world. Its thorough description of experiences that are not usually considered by philosophy adds a note of surprise. By the end of the book, the reader has gained valuable insights into child development, language acquisition, orality, and the emergence of literacy. This is phenomenological description at its best. Because it uses indicative and not technical concepts, the book can be read not only by experts in phenomenology but also by all those interested in the wonder of human language.

Hatab shows that language is the core of human engagement in practical and social environments, whose meaningfulness precedes and grounds reflective scientific accounts. Language is not just a set of significations, a representational tool of thinking; it is nested in human practices, and it opens up a relation that each human being has with the lived world. Hatab illustrates his thesis with concrete cases that pertain to a pre-reflective and pre-scientific stage of the individual and cultural history: language acquisition in early childhood and Greek oral poetry. Hatab's point is that they are not merely incomplete experiences that are completed by later developments; he argues, on the contrary, that they testify what it means for a human being to be in this world. The cases reveal some aspects of this belonging that a reflective and scientific stage leaves by the side.

The phenomenological description of these experiences represents, I believe, the main appeal of Hatab's book. His keen descriptions effectively support his thesis of the phenomenological priority of language. They are also an exemplary way of doing phenomenology, which is more attached to the description of life experiences than to a transcendental analysis of consciousness. This kind of approach allows Hatab to interact with scientific studies of the cases he treats seamlessly. His descriptions borrow, indeed, from numerous empirical studies of child development, language acquisition, orality, and literacy.

Hatab's view on language is a Heideggerian one. Nevertheless, he develops a compelling phenomenology of language in his own terms, avoiding the trap of Heideggerian parlance. The problem that rises from his book has to do with its main predicament: How do reflective features build upon originary life experiences? Are some of these features such as causality derivative, as Hatab seems to maintain, or originary? In the following, I will highlight the book's main ideas, and finish with some critical remarks.

This is the second volume of a two-volume project on proto-phenomenology and language. The first volume is Proto-Phenomenology and the Nature of Language: Dwelling in Speech I (2017) which Hatab summarizes in the first chapter. This summary offers the highlights of his phenomenological view on language. What Hatab calls proto-phenomenology focuses on the originary experience of our lived world, which precedes scientific accounts. The term "proto" emphasizes this commitment to originarity. Although phenomenology was born as a regaining of "things themselves," he warns that some phenomenological models still yield reflective and representational prejudices, which isolate abstract contents from their existential context. Proto-phenomenology should start from our pre-reflective experience in which the world is not an object standing in front of us, but a horizon of existential (Hatab also calls it factical) meaningfulness disclosed by language. In this sense, meaning is primarily a matter of orientation, value, and purpose.[1]

The lived world has three dimensions: the personal-world, the environing-world, and the social-world. The personal-world is not made up by introspective mental states, but by the immersion in fields of action. The self does not reach self-awareness apart from this absorption. The environing-world is the range of natural, social, and cultural milieus in which the self lives. Hatab understands this ecological network in light of the Greek word oikos, which means home or dwelling. To be sure, the dwelling in the environing-world does not exclude reflection. Immersion can sometimes be followed by exposition, which considers something apart from the immersed practice to which it belongs. This happens especially when there is an interference with the flow of the practice-field. Hatab describes it mostly in antagonistic terms, as contravention. For instance, we become cognizant of a pen's properties when it stops writing. He seems to prefer contravention as a mode of exposition, but he does not give any strong rationale for his preference. Finally, the social-world entails an immersion that occurs through empathy. Empathy is perhaps the highest form of immersion because it represents an engaged attunement that generates the psychological enlargement of the self.

Hatab finds this immersion evident, especially in cases where reflective exposition has not yet blossomed, namely in child development and the Ancient Greek culture of orality. They reveal the originary dwelling of the human being and the fittingness of language in the personal, environing, and social world. Chapter 2, "The Child's World", starts by noting that philosophy rarely considers early childhood because the mental states of children are not fully accessible. We do not remember our first-person experience in the early years because our memory does not reach so far. Second, little children cannot verbally convey their experience to us. This inconvenience does not limit proto-phenomenology, because its indicative concepts are not grounded in mental states, but in meaningful engagements in the environing world.

Thus proto-phenomenology is better equipped than other child development theories to capture children's behavior, social relations, reactions, etc. Indeed, proto-phenomenology attests that child development entails a knowledge that arises as an outside-in rather than an interior process. Children develop through tacit habits, intimations, and situated know-how, which are flowing from their immediate immersion in the environing world. This process starts with affective attunement that has wonder at its core. Children have a strong interest in things that surround themselves. Their wonder and delight in experiencing these things testify that the world in which they are immersed is not primarily an objective external given, but rather a world that matters to them. They also tend to perceive other things (natural or artificial) in an animistic mode. While psychologists like Piaget judge their animism as egocentric, Hatab thinks that it reveals children's full engaged immersion in their environing world. Conversely, they experience exposition, especially in the mode of contravention. A large part of the learning process includes failures and obstacles. For instance, when a child learns to walk, she adjusts her body balance in conjunction with the experience of falling.

The immersion of children in the personal- and social-world occurs through imitation and joint attention. Imitation is not merely the copying of external behavior, but rather "an undivided co-being and we-feeling in infancy." (66) For instance, a child takes up adult reactions to various experiences: he smiles when he sees people laughing, he winces at other's pain. This sort of imitation needs personal interaction. No child would, indeed, imitate a robot. Thus, children's imitation entails personal interest in the social-world and the intimation of the purposiveness and meaningfulness of human behavior. Similarly, joint attention reveals the common focus on something meaningful. When pointing to something or looking at their mothers pointing to something, children are intersubjectively engaged in the world.

Self-awareness in early childhood does not reach the level of a full self until the acquisition of language. There are, however, many experiences that contribute to it, and that manifest the immersion in the tripartite personal-social-environing world. For instance, infants are aware of their bodies. If they see themselves in the mirror and notice a mark on their body, they will reach out to touch or remove it. Also, they can acquire a sense of self through negative experiences such as separation anxiety. Hatab thinks that in the case of personal and social-immersion, too, contravention is crucial for child development. Once again, he does not give any rationale for the preeminence of contravention.

Chapter 3 describes the process of language acquisition in a phenomenological manner that strikes a middle way between two linguistic models: nativist and environmentalist. The former sees language acquisition as rooted in a priori structures in children's minds, whereas the latter sees it as received from the environment. Both models presuppose that language is a system of signs that relate subject and object. Contrary to this presupposition, Hatab shows that children learn new words as they are attached to particular experiences engaging their well-being. A child will understand the particular statement "Pick up your toys" better than the general statement "A doll is a toy." Children's language learning bears upon the familiarity with immediate experience, and not so much upon interior mental states that correspond to concepts. This pragmatic language acquisition indicates, in Hatab's eyes, that semantic meaning is nothing but the exposition of the existential meaning, which is originarily disclosed in language.

The immersive familiarity of children with their environment is mediated by social interaction with parents and caregivers. The process of learning takes place in face-to-face conversations, which entail a wide variety of intersubjective features: turn-taking, joint attention, fittingness of speech. For instance, concealment and reappearance games have a communicative structure based on a shared meaning. The object at the center of these games is part of a broader communication that intimates meaningful behavior through parents' linguistic prompts: "Here he is! Where is he? He's gone." Joint attention, Hatab shows, is very important in the acquisition of language. Children start by making utterances to draw the attention of adults. These social interactions are, at the same time, embodied. They involve touching, smelling, seeing, hearing.

The last three chapters deal with orality and literacy in the Greek world. Orality represents the original dwelling-in-speech. Hatab believes that a phenomenology of language must challenge the dominion of literacy and bring the originary experience of orality into focus. Literacy builds upon orality and triggers the reflective stage, which, in Hatab's eyes, derives from existential immersion. Indeed, Hatab shows that the emergence of literacy is an essential factor in the advent of Greek philosophy. In this sense, Plato's critique of poetry is nothing else than literacy taking over orality. Chapter 4 highlights the differences between orality and literacy in Ancient Greece. Greek oral poetry has a didactic purpose in presenting moments of factical life: war, social relations, family, work. Because it relies on its temporal performance, oral speech has a unique flexibility that anchors it in the lived world. While the written text is stable, oral speech is a continual flow of appearing and disappearing. The Platonic search for definitions puts a stop to this flow and eliminates, through abstraction, the existential context of lived experience.

In chapter 5, Hatab takes a step further to show that oral poetry differs from philosophy not only in its form, but also in its content. The human experience depicted by the Homeric poems has traits similar to the experience described by proto-phenomenology: embodied engagement in the environing world, the union of knowledge and feeling in existential meaningfulness, and decentralized selfhood attached to forces out of our control. Greek philosophy has weakened these traits, accentuating the intellectual dimension and the centrality of the self as fully in charge of one's life. The Homeric heroes differ thus from the Platonic and Aristotelian self since their selfhood is strongly performative and social. In their case, Hatab writes, "measures of value stem from this ecological field, not an inward self-estimation." (191) Honor and forces surpassing human control are defining for a Homeric hero.

Finally, chapter 6 surveys some of the effects of literacy on the modern world. The process of abstraction set off by the stability of literacy unfolds in some significant moments: the Latin translation of Greek philosophy, the discovery of print, and modern science. First, while Greek philosophical language was still embedded in native speech, Latin translations emphasized technical meanings over factical sense. The status of Latin as the official language of a whole empire increased the formal instruction of foreigners. Even long after the end of the empire, written Latin remained the official language of Western culture, unchanged by time or geography. Thus, in Hatab's eyes, the Latin paradigm marked the passage from orality to literacy, stimulating abstract analysis, linguistic theory, grammatical structure, and logical argument. Second, the discovery of print brought standardization and generated an objective, systematic, and technological model of language. The new availability created by printing also transitioned from oral group readings of hand-written manuscripts to individual reading, thus enhancing modern selfhood. Third, the blossoming of literacy triggered the development of modern science through formalization and verification. This development was a departure from Aristotle's physics, which relied on concepts such as purpose and potentiality, still anchored into factical experience. However, Hatab maintains that literacy is not a decline from noble origins, but an amplification of human possibilities, even though it abstracts from factical meanings. "A literate person is simply more human than is otherwise possible." (266) The scope of proto-phenomenology is to unveil the existential foundation of literacy and thus give a more vibrant account of language starting from dwelling-in-speech.

This relation between pre-reflective and reflective dimensions of language represents, I believe, the most problematic element of Hatab's book. First, Hatab often describes the process of reflection in negative terms, as contravention or elimination of existential meanings through abstraction. Such a description does not seem to capture the full extent of exposition. A good part of our human experience is reflective and occurs through positive moments such as discovery, invention, innovation, etc. Hatab is perhaps aware of this insufficiency. In his conclusion, he recommends that proto-phenomenology identify the disclosive possibilities of literacy as well as the intersection of writing and speech. A more comprehensive view of exposition would serve proto-phenomenology very well.

Second, it is questionable whether all the features that Hatab labels as reflective and derivative are indeed so. For instance, the causal explanation is one he most mentions. He classifies it as a reflective exposition and distinguishes it from a phenomenological description. However, Hatab does not clarify whether we also have a pre-reflective experience of causality, before scientific causal explanation. He briefly mentions children's awareness of causal relations, indicated in words such as "because" and "so." But throughout the rest of the book, he seems to have in mind exclusively a scientific construct of causality, defined as regularity and connection, and derivative from originary immersion. This seemingly Humean position already has a reflective kind of bias. Hatab does not show whether causality is part of the originary immersion, or is only derivative. Upon closer inspection, causality seems to be omnipresent in everyday life. Little children become quickly aware of the causal relationship between the hot stove and burnt fingers when they touch a hot stove. Existential meaningfulness could hardly exclude causal relations. To be fair, the exclusion of causality from the originary factical immersion pertains to Heideggerian orthodoxy. Heidegger dismisses causality as an artificial concept that mirrors productive human activity, not the real fabric of the world.[2] More recently, David E. Cooper states that meaning is distinct from causal relations and represents a relation to human life as a whole.[3] However, neither Heidegger nor his followers give a compelling account of what concretely happens when a hot stove burns a curious child's finger. Hatab's view of pre-reflective immersion would gain much from a consistent approach to causality and causal explanation.

[1] Lawrence J. Hatab, Proto-Phenomenology and the Nature of Language. Dwelling in Speech I (London/New York: Rowman & Littlefield, 2017) 43.

[2] Martin Heidegger, Contributions to Philosophy (Of the Event), transl. Richard Rojcewiz and Daniela Vallega-Neu (Bloomington/Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 2012) 100; History of the Concept of Time. Prolegomena, trans. Theodore Kisiel (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 1985) 239; The Question Concerning Technology, in Martin Heidegger, Basic Writings, ed. David Farrell Krell (New York: Harper Collins, 1993) 313.

[3] David E. Cooper, Meaning (London/New York: Routledge, 2014) 30.