Proust as Philosopher: The Art of Metaphor

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Miguel de Beistegui, Proust as Philosopher: The Art of Metaphor, Dorotheé Bonnigal Katz, Simon Sparks and Miguel de Beistegui (trs.), Routledge, 2012, 136pp., $37.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415584326.

Reviewed by Katherine Elkins, Kenyon College


This book adds to a growing body of work that puzzles through the deeply philosophical nature of Proust's In Search of Lost Time. The young Marcel was an avid student of philosophy and named the literary journal he created with friends after Plato's Symposium. The fact that he abandoned his philosophical studies in his early twenties, however, has led many critics to imagine that Proust's philosophical positions mirror those to which he was exposed in his youth. For this reason, one common approach to Proust's philosophy has been to catalogue philosophical concepts as though spotting animals on safari.

Miguel de Beistegui, by contrast, belongs to a line of philosophers who have begun to tease out just how philosophically innovative Proust is. Here he focuses on the art of metaphor, suggesting that Proust's metaphors allow for a transposition in space-time and an experience of difference not easily subsumed by simplistic notions of identity.

It is always refreshing to see an approach that makes sense of and responds to a philosophical dilemma. Beistegui does this by showing how relevant the art of metaphor is to Proust's entire conceptual framework. The dilemma has interested readers of Proust for quite some time. The young narrator in Proust's novel finds himself deflated by two ways of being in the world, neither of which allows for a perception of reality as he believes it to be. On the one hand, he experiments with a romanticism that relies too strongly on an imaginative projection clearly out of touch with reality. True, the vision shows the world to be enchanted, but the enchantment lies wholly within the viewer's perceptual apparatus. At other times, the narrator views the world through a realistic lens that shows the real to be mundane and disappointing. But is this truly all there is to the world, the narrator wonders? What of the moments when he experiences an intimation of something greater?

This dilemma touches on the limitations of both subjectivity and objectivity. Romantic, imaginative projection seems too purely personal and subjective. Realism, on the other hand, reveals an inhuman world shorn of all personal, cultural, or aesthetic significance. Proustian metaphor, Beistegui persuasively argues, solves this dilemma by revealing the underlying enchantment of the world to be based on correspondences that bring together the personal, the cultural and the real in one unified experience.

In a convincing reading of Proust's well-known hawthorn scene, Beistegui reads the pink hawthorns as an aesthetic experience that joins cultural and individual correspondences. The hawthorns remind the narrator of church at the same time as they remind him of a childhood experience eating strawberry-flecked cream cheese. This impression of hawthorns sets up correspondences that operate both on a shared, cultural level and on an intensely personal and subjective one. It takes the personal symbolism of a secret and private world of correspondences -- a world first articulated, I would argue, by the symbolists -- and shows how the private correspondences are most profound when married to a preexisting and culturally shared symbolism. I have written about this elsewhere, and it is a point worth stressing since Proust's memory is often assumed to be highly individual.

So far so good, but Beistegui goes further by showing this personal and cultural vision to be grounded in a reality that makes the vision possible in the first place. For Proust, Beistegui writes, things have "the power to awaken us to the world of essences." That we can still be surprised by reality shows that our impressions of it trump the pitfalls of the subjective and objective viewpoints. They trump realist disappointment by showing reality to be enchanted and significant because imbued with hidden correspondences. But they also give the lie to imaginative projection. Were it merely a matter of imagination, we would fail to be surprised. The newness of the experience confirms an aesthetic communication through which knowledge comes to us from the outside world. Unlike Kant, Beistegui argues, Proust shows that we can get beyond our conceptual apparatus and gain a knowledge of the world that is not already predetermined by our perceptual-conceptual framework.

Lest we jump to the conclusion that these truths are Platonic in nature, however, Beistegui quickly clarifies that this idealism is almost the reverse of Plato's. As Merleau-Ponty so clearly argues in The Visible and the Invisible -- in my opinion a work that is one long meditation on Proust -- the sensible access to the truth is constitutive of that truth. Truth appears as the lining of the sensible, visible world.

Beistegui's argument clearly articulates how groundbreaking Proust's impressions are by showing them as more complex than earlier philosophical models. But Proust departs from his contemporary models as well. Bergson, for example, is most concerned with habitual memory. Proust, on the other hand, stresses a knowledge of the unknown that manifests only when habit is broken. Proust may have more in common with the early psychologists like Taine and Ribot, who first described emotionally affective memories. But even here we see divergence. Proust's affective experience takes us beyond the purely subjective towards an experience that is not merely psychological and mind-centered. Proust's real insight, Beistegui claims, lies in the metaphorical, transpositional nature of all affective memory.

Beistegui is at his strongest when he argues for the larger implications of this reading, and here he makes the claim, quite convincingly, that Proust sees this type of aesthetic communication as far more successful than the types of communication between humans in love and friendship. In friendship, Proust reminds us, we are continually looking for confirmation of identity. We find in the other only what reminds us of ourselves. If love proves more alluring because we are often attracted by difference, it ultimately fails for another reason. The difference we seek recedes as we try to possess it. We can never truly grasp, Proust argues, the unknown world our lover represents.

The narrator's attempt to capture what is essential in his beloved Albertine will always fail, for her identity is inherently fugitive. Beistegui writes:

The point of the narrator's search, therefore, isn't to record the variation of an irreducible identity that's there from start to finish and that would be disclosed either at the start or at the end. The point isn't to determine what Albertine is, to draw out her essence . . . No: Albertine's complete throughout all her metamorphoses . . . while we can never say what she truly is, essentially. (90)

The metaphorical experience of aesthetic communication, by contrast, touches on this experience of difference. Metaphor, Beistegui writes, reveals a "singularity that defines the point or the threshold where a thing communicates with and becomes something else" (85). If much of Proust's novel is an attempt to come to terms with a world that is in a constant state of flux and becoming, metaphor is the one tool that allows for a perception and portrayal of things and people as they become something else.

Here Beistegui is implicitly taking issue with the standard approach that views modernist novels, including those of Proust, as primarily epistemological in nature. What can the narrator truly know about Albertine? She is fugitive, and his attempts to grasp any stable knowledge of her prove futile. Instead, Beistegui insists that Proust's art of metaphor is ontologically-poetically based. The work of art, he writes, does not represent, but rather generates a new time and space. It reveals truths that are always in the process of becoming. For this reason, the way we access the truth -- through a metaphor that translates the particularity of time and place by bringing it into contact with another -- is essential to the truth itself.

Beistegui is Levinas's philosophical heir, and much of what he says about Proust concretizes what Levinas first describes in "Meaning and Sense". Whereas Wittgenstein suggests that metaphor devolves into nonsense and demarcates the limits of what we can say about reality, Levinas, following Hediegger's lead, argues that metaphor is grounded in the real and illuminates something fundamental about its nature. Both Beistegui and Levinas suggest that there is something that comes to us from the real that we do not invent even as we create it through our translation using a personal-cultural prism. Metaphor, Beistegui writes, reveals "something about the world" and even corresponds "to an economy that governs the real as a whole" (73).

The trickiest part of the claim, in my opinion, lies in this suggestion that sense is culturally created but nonetheless determined by something in the real that allows us to perceive it in the first place. Here Beistegui fails to illuminate what still remains unclear in Levinas's argument. If perception is filtered through a cultural prism and any truth is time-sensitive, can one truly argue for anything fundamental to the experience of the real that transcends time and culture? What exactly is this essence that Beistegui and Levinas are describing, and how does the real make possible this experience? I am not arguing that they are wrong -- certainly they are right to question how we experience the new if our perceptual-cultural apparatus only allows us to see what we expect. But I believe there is more that needs to be thought through here.

Beistegui is least interesting when he channels other thinkers, whether Merleau-Ponty, Deleuze or Levinas, and at his strongest when he takes Proust on his own terms. As an example, his homage to Walter Benjamin's reading of Proust shows perhaps a bit too much fealty. Beistegui is in complete agreement with Benjamin that there is a residue of "unlived experience" that resurfaces with involuntary memory. "Something" Beistegui writes, "resurfaces or returns that has never actually happened" (63). Benjamin's insight is provocative, but if we are to take Proust at his word the situation might be more complex than Benjamin and Beistegui suppose.

Samuel Beckett was the first to draw attention to Proust's claim that the best example of the impression is not the more famous madeleine, but the experience of listening to a phrase of music. Beistegui discusses this musical experience, but only as Proust's character, Charles Swann, listens.

If we look at Proust's narrator's experience, however, it shows us something quite different. The narrator's experience of listening to a musical phrase resembles repetition more than transport. The first experience of listening to music is confusing because it is defined most prominently by a sense of temporal flow and continual becoming. But repeated listening allows the intimation of a unique world of identity beneath this flux.

Proust's description is, of course, the spiritual heir to the memorial repetition made famous by William Wordsworth. In Lines Composed Above Tintern Abbey, Wordsworth explains that the first impressions of the natural setting are hard to make sense of. With a return to the site, however, memory allows a depth of perception that affords insight and significance. In part this is because the imagination has processed and stored the experience, so that the second experience is a blend of present perception and memorial imagining.

I see Proust as rewriting Wordsworthian memory with a slight difference. The initial experience, rather than leaving a clear image that is revisited in memory before the return, is instead completely forgotten, thus allowing the repetition of the experience to feel both new and old at the same time. Is it possible that the shock of the new is made possible, not as Beistegui suggests, because it reveals the real, but rather because of the process of forgetting? Is it due to internal processes rather than an external reality? Even more importantly, what happens to this older form of memorial understanding that, at least in some part, is based on recognition and identity? Is it completely subsumed, or is there an extent to which for Proust, too, memory deepens experience and allows for recognition of the similar made possible through repetition? After all, the experience of involuntary memory contains, Proust insists, intimations of both survival (identity) and annihilation (difference).

Beistegui argues that the Proustian metaphor transposes one space-time to another by bringing back a past that cannot be wholly subsumed in the present, but it is hard to imagine that the experience of listening to music produces such an acute sense of difference or reveals an unlived past. Rather, there is a sense in which Proust suggests that in a world of great flux and change, we can know only that which returns in recognizable form after a prolonged absence. If this is the case, the novel is, pace Beistegui, profoundly epistemological.

This is not say that Beistegui is entirely wrong. He is more concerned with examples like Proust's madeleine that, as I have also argued elsewhere, may indeed be ontological and poetic in nature. But even here Beistegui's claims raise important questions. A present self, he suggests, connects to a past self without affirming a permanent self that would cancel out the differences between past and present. Metaphor operates "like a power of dissemblance capable of bringing differences together without the mediation of any sort of identity" (75). But perhaps the emphasis Beistegui places on difference conceals that there is a still a kind of recognition of identity happening, albeit a complex recognition that can only happen through repetition. Is not the self that collects both present and past selves evidence of an identity that transcends both present and past?

While Beistegui shows us just how post-modern Proust is -- and this reviewer thanks him for that -- I wonder if the contradiction inherent in Proust's formulation might allow us to rethink Proust's philosophy as innovative precisely where it joins earlier formulations with more contemporary ones. How can we make sense of the difficult whole, of an experience of both survival and annihilation, identity and difference?

Proust likens the work of art to many other art forms -- the creation of a dress, for example, and a cathedral. But Beistegui suggests that these metaphors are inaccurate, since they place too much emphasis on unity and stasis rather than on difference and becoming. Instead, he turns to Proust's actual mode of novelistic production, a continual and seemingly unending process of cutting and pasting paperoles -- paper slips -- that allowed Proust to expand the middle of his novel in a fashion that, according to de Beistegui, reveals a monstrous distortion.

But might one not argue that all of these seemingly fragmented paperoles create a world of correspondences on steroids? These correspondences show that connections, while numerous, are nonetheless particular and finite because, as old age descends, the present continually reminds one of the past. The final impressions of the last volume bring back the past in all its vividness, but only to show the present as already linked (and therefore fixed) to a world of past correspondences. They create a whole, however contradictory and complex, that ultimately reveals the truthfulness of many first impressions.

De Beistegui is bold to write yet one more book on philosophy in Proust. Bold and successful, since his attention to metaphor allows him to discover new insights, sometimes by clarification, other times through expansion into uncharted territory. When Beistegui turns to examples like the hawthorn and situates this phenomenological reading in counterdistinction to well-known ideas of Kant and Plato, he brings added clarity to what Merleau-Ponty first tried to articulate. While paying homage to Deleuze, Beistegui nonetheless breaks new ground, especially in his reading of metaphor. This reading also takes us in a very different direction from the understanding of metaphor in Roman Jakobson's well-known work.

The author, with the aid of his translators, Katz and Simon, creates a work that is artful and a pleasure to read. A book that could easily have filled hundreds of pages is instead characterized by a perfect balance between brevity and clarity. This reviewer wishes more writers would follow his lead. Of course, if he is correct in his argument about Proustian metaphor, style cannot be divorced from substance, and what makes him so successful stylistically also ensures his conceptual success. Beistegui gives us much to think about.