Proust's In Search of Lost Time: Philosophical Perspectives


Katherine Elkins (ed.), Proust’s In Search of Lost Time: Philosophical Perspectives. Oxford University Press, 2023, 251pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780190921583.

Reviewed by Tom Stern, University College London


This is a volume in the Oxford Studies in Philosophy and Literature series, which offers ‘philosophical perspectives’ on great works. The editor has brought together a varied and expert group of writers. Some have set the tone for philosophical writing on Proust for years. Others, experts on Proust, are not obviously philosophers (except in the loosest senses of that term) and some topics are not obviously philosophical (likewise). The editor does not reveal a principle of selection in terms of contributors or subject matter and the book gives the impression that she has largely let everyone get on with it. Whether or not that matters will depend on what the reader is after, and it has its advantages. Those inclined to condone (or approve of) a strikingly disparate collection might at least acknowledge that it provides something of a challenge to its reviewer.

After the editor’s introduction, Joshua Landy asks why Proust writes a novel, and not a philosophical treatise, given that Proust seems to have considered the latter. His answer is a lively, more scholarly, alternative version of How Proust Can Change Your Life, which (unlike Alain de Botton’s original) argues that one must read Proust’s novel, and that it must be a novel, if it is to change one’s life in the six ways he outlines. Elisabeth A. Ladenson then unpacks the intricate relations between three entities: Proust’s own writings on the relationship between a great author and his biography; the Englishman George Painter’s biography of Proust; and the announcement, by Roland Barthes, who read and admired both Proust and Painter, of the death of the author. It is a fascinating tale, artfully told, of an entrancing, disingenuous dance. Painter tries to ignore Proust’s clearly stated objections to projects like Painter’s (which interpret literature via biography), while effectively fabricating the biography itself using material from the literary fiction. And Barthes masks his obvious interest in Painter’s (in fact fictional) Proust biography with less-than-convincing theoretical justifications. It’s hard to draw general, let alone philosophical conclusions (even about Proust) from this remarkable story, and Ladenson does not try.

Focusing on music, Christie Macdonald places Proust alongside Rousseau, whom Proust names only twice in his novel. Patrick Bray considers the novel’s relation to seriality, linking the way the novel was published with the ways in which repetition, variation, and rupture feature in the plot and the themes. Richard Moran’s ‘Swann’s Medical Philosophy’ takes its title from a passage in Swann’s Way (see below). The medical philosophy in question is the attitude taken by Swann, and some of the men of his age and social circle, towards their desires. Robert Pippin summarises what one might (mistakenly, he holds) take to be a Proustian theory of love and jealousy (170–1) before arguing that it cannot be ascribed to Proust or even to his narrator. Dora Zhang examines the role of weather in the novel—‘a dependable source of both comforting regularity and unexpected surprise’ (209). Finally, the editor’s own essay, ‘Proust’s Consciousness’, links Proust with contemporary debates about qualia in the philosophy of mind, claiming that Proustian impressions ‘offer a window onto the hard problem of consciousness’ (234).

Volumes in this series make no claim to comprehensive coverage of philosophical themes, topics or questions raised by the work—a tall order in any case, perhaps especially with Proust’s mammoth novel.[1] Here, though, as my summary indicates, the collection does not cover even the most salient, explicit philosophical themes of In Search of Lost Time: no chapter on memory, as such; no chapter on time. Zhang’s chapter takes up Eve Kosofsky Sedgwick’s joke that ‘À la recherche du temps perdu’ might be translated ‘In search of lost weather’ (since temps is ambiguous between weather and time). But if one had to choose between a chapter on weather or time, should the latter not win out? Katherine Elkins claims that many essays ‘investigate aspects of temporal experience’ (5), so perhaps she thinks the topic has been covered indirectly. But the lack even of an index entry for ‘time’ would somewhat count against that claim. Certainly, some central themes or questions are directly addressed (by Landy, Pippin and Elkins, for example), and the novel can be illuminated by reflection on apparently peripheral aspects.   

The absence of organisation manifests in a more scholarly way, too. The question of how to cite Proust’s long novel does not allow for an easy answer, especially refracted through English translation.[2] Elkins notes that she permits authors to cite from the Scott Moncrieff (et al.) or Prendergast (ed.) translations, or to provide their own translations (7–8). Contrary to standard practice in volumes of this kind, she did not insist that citations refer to at least one French and one English edition, nor even that authors use the same French edition across the collection. Moreover, citation is often ambiguous or inaccurate, or even sometimes altogether lacking. Elkins herself uses the Prendergast edition (Penguin), but almost none of her page references matches my copy of the same edition. This will be an unusually frustrating volume for any reader, francophone or not, who likes looking up quotations.

If one theme emerges, it is how (if at all) Proust’s novel makes its philosophical claims. In Search of Lost Time is at once an obvious and a distinctly challenging choice for a philosophical perspective. Proust was a philosophical novelist, in at least three senses. He studied philosophy intensively, in ways which strongly influenced his novel; the novel’s narrator is prone to offering lengthy philosophical reflections; and the whole novel, if we are to believe some of Proust’s claims about it, is intended to reveal something resembling a unified, philosophical outlook. The first of these dimensions receives next to no attention in this volume. Elkins mentions Proust’s philosophical training, and Moran looks briefly at Proust’s Schopenhauerian context (2; 135–140). In effect, there is nothing on the philosophy that Proust himself read, or on the scholarly literature devoted to unpacking its connection with the philosophical remarks in the novel.[3] Although, no criticism of any individual author is intended, this fact is nonetheless surprising when one reflects on the whole book.

Much more attention is given to the narrator’s theories, to Proust’s claims about the novel as a whole, and to the challenges facing his philosophical interpreter. After all, nothing in the novel is stated, uncomplicatedly, in Proust’s own voice and the protagonist (the narrator’s younger self) is deeply flawed. As noted repeatedly in this collection, Proust wrote that the novel was meant to ‘bring to life’ a ‘belief system’, but only over the course of the book: ‘I am therefore obliged to depict errors, without feeling compelled to say that I consider them to be errors; too bad for me if the reader believes that I take them for truth.’[4] But it’s too bad for us, now. Like a lot of philosophical writing on Proust, this volume radiates the anxiety that, in drawing out the philosophical content or significance of the novel, one might take depicted errors as truth. Many authors take on the challenge thoughtfully and substantively. Their Proust rarely lines up directly behind the narrator’s claims. We are ‘forewarned’, as Pippin has it, against ‘easy identification’ of narrator’s and author’s views, but we should not be ‘so cautious’ as to miss what Proust called the ‘intellectual beliefs’ that drove him to write (164–5). Landy’s narrator revises his theories as the novel goes along, giving the reader a sense of what it’s like to get things wrong, but also offering a warning not to take every theoretical claim at face value (31; 37–8). Moran calls the narrator an ‘Unreliable Philosopher’ (130), claiming ‘we are meant to see through [his philosophical observations]’ and to see, moreover, the distorting role that philosophy can play in our lives (129–130; for similar remarks, see Elkins, 4, 16; Bray, 110).

The obstacles to establishing anything by the name of ‘Proust’s philosophy’ are significant. Nonetheless, I often had the sense that more mystery or unreliability was being heaped upon Proust’s narrator’s philosophical pronouncements than was required. One of Landy’s examples of the narrator revising his theoretical views is as follows: the narrator calls ‘reasonable’ the ‘Celtic belief’ that the souls of the dead are held captive in non-human objects or entities; but then the narrator tells us that, in Landy’s words, ‘there’s no life after death’ (31).[5] Is this a theoretical revision? Not obviously. The sense in which the Celtic belief is reasonable is that objects may provoke involuntary memories which recall to us those we have lost. The sense in which we do not have life after death (or that ‘eternal duration’ is not guaranteed) is that we die. Landy’s other example is the claim at the end of the first volume that the past is effectively lost versus the claim in the final volume that it may be found again (37–8). If this is a good example of a theoretical revision on the part of the narrator, then it is at least a special case, being the major organising principle of the novel, advertised both in its title and in that of its seventh volume.

A counterpart to the heaping of suspicion on the narrator’s philosophising is a relative absence of interest, in the volume as a whole, in what turns out to be the narrator’s apparently triumphant final philosophical view, which connects the self, art, memory, and time. Limited references to this view are found (119, 165), but no author sets it out at any length, let alone engages it. In the final part of this review, I’ll focus on two cases where I thought the narrator’s apparent solutions deserved a moment more in the sun.

Both Pippin and Moran seek to undermine solipsistic aspects of the narrator’s theoretical pronouncements in the earlier volumes, both focusing broadly on love and desire. They look carefully at remarks made by the narrator (almost exclusively prior to the final volume) which may indeed indicate some distance from these views. Both discussions are close and subtle, shedding light on the intricacies of Proust’s writing. But neither explores what light the narrator’s final position—the one Proust claimed that the novel was shaped around—might throw on these questions. Broadly, the narrator’s official, final answer to desire and satisfaction lies in the work of art, which genuinely brings one mind in contact with another, in a way that regular social desire cannot.

One of Pippin’s targets is the apparently Proustian view that, when we love someone, their ‘views and experiences and even [their] identity do not matter’ (167). He points to instances in which characters care passionately about what the beloved thinks (172–3) and suggests that the final volume does not undermine this serious engagement with the other (176). But, pace Pippin (171, 176), the narrator’s final pronouncements certainly appear to confirm the relative or indeed absolute insignificance of the beloved: ‘the impossibility of their satisfying us’, he suggests, is a ‘sign of the unreality of others’.[6] If so, characters who, in earlier volumes, take seriously the views and experiences of others seem, in the end, like they are making a mistake, subsequently corrected.

Moran interprets Swann’s medical philosophy (vol. I, 274–5) as follows. In love with Odette, Swann believes nonetheless that the time will come when she is a matter of indifference to him. He attempts to imagine himself into that future indifference, therapeutically aspiring to it (141), to contextualise and reduce the grip of his current infatuation, which he accordingly treats as something to be managed, controlled and, ‘if possible, eliminat[ed]’ (128). A key move (for Moran) in this therapeutic philosophy is the treatment of loving another as merely a form of subjective disturbance in the lover. Desire in general is seen as a psychological discomfort which desire satisfaction eliminates. On such a model, attaining what we desire is equivalent, psychologically, to eradicating that desire, with the latter winning out as a practical strategy on familiar Schopenhauerian grounds: more stability, evenness, and independence. Plausible in the case of thirst, Moran thinks this model implausible in the case of other, more nuanced desires, such as the narrator’s desire to become a writer or his desire for the attention of his beloved. His Proust ultimately rejects this model, distinguishing between (and preferring) really becoming a writer to the loss of that desire altogether. The medical philosophy, sometimes attractive to the narrator himself, is therefore recognised as a false comfort, an ideological strategy, not a neutral theory or piece of practical wisdom. Moran associates the assumptions of the medical philosophy with Schopenhauer and Freud, whom Proust surpasses, precisely by abandoning their assumptions about desire.

The distinction between psychological and logical satisfaction, between feeling satisfied and getting the thing that you desire, is fruitfully applied by Moran to Schopenhauer and Freud. But the evidence that ‘Proust parts company with [. . .] Freud and Schopenhauer’ (152) on this point (or even that he has the medical philosophy, as described by Moran, in mind) is thin. By the end of the novel, the narrator, as we saw, affirms the unreality of others, who cannot satisfy us. Getting what we want (logical satisfaction) in the social world is said to be followed by sadness, and even the pleasure of loving Albertine was only perceived ‘inversely’, that is, by the absence of anguish (on both points, see IV, 454). Moran tends to run together the narrator’s social desires (e.g., for Gilberte’s attention) and the desire to become an artist (151), whereas Proust’s narrator is working hard to keep them apart, because only the latter provides access to reality, while the former misconstrues it. The desire to become a great writer, once fully formed in the final volume, promises a different and genuine form of satisfaction according to the narrator, so he cannot in the end merely equate the satisfaction of that desire with its absence (not that Schopenhauer necessarily would, either). Since the narrator will somehow work his experience of social desire, loss, and agitation into his future novel, he himself may not have been better off without them. But this is not an alternative view of the psychology of social desire so much as a theory of the unique significance of art—a theory which, as noted, Moran does not discuss. Moreover, superficially at least, the narrator’s final view shares something with Moran’s account of Swann’s medical philosophy: as raw material for works of art, social desires, unable to reach the unreal other, are rendered internal, subjective, not ‘entangled in all the complexities of the world’ (127).

In that light, Moran’s chosen passages can be read rather differently. The narrator never describes Swann therapeutically projecting himself forwards. He says only that Swann knows the time will come when he no longer cares about every detail of Odette’s life—which is perfectly true. Nor is Swann (at least, in passages Moran quotes from) described as trying to ‘eliminate’ the desire, or seek its ‘termination’ (cf. 128, 132). On the contrary, via his medical philosophy, he treats his desire as ‘characteristic [of himself] and permanent’ (my emphasis), despite also knowing, at times, that it will cease (Vol. I, 274–5). The narrator is mocking Swann’s philosophy, but he does not target ascetic denial or a ‘purely internal picture of desire’ (145). The joke, it seems to me, is that Swann knows he will cease to love Odette, but he justifies spending vast sums to spy on her every move, because his philosophy allows him to treat his desire as permanent.

Elsewhere, the narrator writes that, gripped with agitating and unfulfilled sexual desire, he himself used to find ‘a certain wisdom in the philosophers who recommend us to set a limit to our desires’, immediately adding (as Moran notes) that he regarded this wisdom as ‘incomplete’ (134).[7] But, here, the young narrator thought it incomplete largely because, still a young man, he found ways to hope that similar desires would be satisfied in the future—which we know, eventually, they will, only to agitate and disappoint him. Again, desire eradication and a purely subjective account of satisfaction is not obviously the target of criticism. We may indeed be better off without social desires, but most of us (like Swann and the younger narrator) will find excuses to pursue them after all.

This review has attempted to take in the collection as a whole, but, by the end, I find myself descending into disputes about the details of one of its chapters—albeit, to my mind, one of the best and most engaging. Perhaps this is, after all, a good reflection on the entire volume. It is hard to take in as one entity, but philosophically minded readers of Proust will surely find themselves drawn in somewhere along the way.

[1] The closest comparison for an anglophone volume on philosophy and Proust would probably be A. Elsner and T. Stern (eds) The Proustian Mind (London: Routledge, 2023). (To disclose the obvious, I am one of the editors.)

[2] References to In Search of Lost Time, in this review, are to the Pléiade edition in four volumes: À la recherche du temps perdu., edited by Jean-Yves Tadié et al. (Paris: Gallimard, 1987–9). To convert my references to this edition to any standard, English edition of Proust, see my Proust page number conversion app: In Search of Saved Time (2022), available at

[3] Most prominently and extensively in Luc Fraisse’s L’éclectisme Philosophique de Marcel Proust (Paris: PUPS, 2013.) and in many other works by Fraisse.

[4] These remarks of Proust’s are cited, or alluded to, at least by Landy (22, 38), Moran (131) and Pippin (163, 176).

[5] Most likely, Landy means the line ‘eternal duration is promised no more to works (oeuvres) than to men’ (volume IV, p. 621, my translation), which is not quite the same as ‘no life after death’. On the ‘Celtic belief’, see volume I, 43–4.

[6] Vol. IV, p. 454, my translation. See also pp. 455, 483, 491. In his defence, Pippin expresses some brief doubts about taking the final volume at face value (165), which I cannot engage here.

[7] Quotations are from Moran’s chapter. The passage is found in vol. II, p. 74.