Psyche: Inventions of the Other, Volume I

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Jacques Derrida, Psyche: Inventions of the Other, Volume I, Peggy Kamuf and Elizabeth Rottenberg (eds.), Stanford University Press, 2007, 437pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804747998.

Reviewed by Paul Patton, University of New South Wales


This volume is the first installment of the English translation of what the editors call a 'work' by Derrida that was originally published in French in 1987 and then republished in two volumes with two additional essays in 1998. It makes up slightly more than half of the original 'work'. However, it is not the first English translation of much of the work that is collected here. Eleven out of the sixteen essays have long been available in English language journals and edited collections. Or almost. As the editors point out, it is misleading to say that these essays were available, firstly because Derrida revised them for inclusion in the French Psyché so that none corresponds exactly to the versions previously published in English, and secondly because the editors themselves have revised the previous translations, sometimes extensively, in accordance with their own principle of 'allegiance or alliance to the idiom of Derrida's writing' (x). Derrida's preface to Psyche describes the contents as texts that have 'accompanied, in some fashion, the works I have published over the last ten years' (xii). This is not so much a 'work' then as a collection of texts that accompanied, in some yet to be determined sense, the works that Derrida published in French between 1977 and 1987, including Spurs: Nietzsche's Styles (1978), Truth in Painting (1978), The Post-Card (1980) and a number of smaller works.

In his preface, Derrida suggests that there are connecting threads that link the diverse texts collected in Psyche, although he does not spell out what these might be. The placement of 'Psyche: Invention of the Other' at the beginning of the book suggests it provides the frame or theoretical space in which the other texts 'link up or correspond to one another' (xii). In French, a psyché is a full length mirror that can be turned at will to reflect what stands at different angles before or behind it. In effect, this collection provides something like a reflection or snapshot of the activity of the French philosopher over this decade. It includes texts written for a variety of occasions ranging from lectures delivered at conferences or colloquia to essays written for collections or special issues of journals devoted to a particular topic or figure. The contents range from important and substantial essays that take up themes of Derrida's earlier or later works to very occasional pieces written to accompany exhibitions, theatrical performances or publications of work by others. Some of the latter are so slight that the reader may well wonder what justifies their inclusion over and above the narcissism that, as Derrida openly acknowledges in his preface, accompanies every gesture of publication, let alone the gesture of republishing that which was already published (xiii). It is not because these texts amount to a representative selection from among all the occasional pieces published during this time-slice from the life of a philosopher much in demand. Another bundle of essays from the same period, dealing with the teaching of philosophy and its place in the university institution, has been published in a separate volume (translated into English as two volumes: Who's Afraid of Philosophy? Right to Philosophy 1, Stanford 2002, and Eyes of the University: Right to Philosophy 2, Stanford 2004).

Moreover, it is far from self-evident what representation and representativity would mean in the context of the body of work written by a philosopher responding to so many different obligations, occasions and friends. Indeed, the concept and the word 'representation' provide the subject matter of one of the most philosophically interesting essays in this volume, 'Envoi,' in which Derrida argues not only that this word has different meanings in epistemological, aesthetic and political contexts but also that it is doubtful that contexts of use are ever sufficiently 'saturated' to specify a determinant meaning. 'Envoi' was an opening address to the annual meeting of the Sociétés de Philosophie de Langue Française at the University of Strasbourg in 1980, in which Derrida manages both to begin or 'send off' (envoi) this conference and at the same time to question the premises implicit in a gathering of representatives (envois) of French language philosophy societies devoted to the theme or topic of representation. Like several of the other more substantial pieces in this collection, this essay refers back to themes in his earlier work: here, the conception of language and meaning that has informed philosophy's conception of its task since Plato:

Beneath the diversity of words from diverse languages, beneath the diversity of uses of the same word, beneath the diversity of contexts or of syntactic systems, the same sense or the same referent, the same representative content would keep its inviolable identity. Language, every language, would be representative, a system of representatives, but the content represented, the represented of this representation (meaning, thing, and so on) would be a presence and not a representation. (102)

'The Retrait of Metaphor' also refers back to an important early essay, 'White Mythologies,' which dealt with the supposed opposition between concept and metaphor in the history of philosophy. Derrida here responds to criticisms of that essay by Paul Ricoeur and also elaborates his earlier comments about Heidegger, in part by unraveling the complicated senses of trait and retrait in what are translated into French as Heidegger's remarks about the retrait of Being. Another essay, 'Telepathy,' takes the form of a series of 'out-takes' that should have appeared in La Carte Postale (1980). These are partly fictional letters and postcards to an absent friend, in some cases about and in some cases apparently by Freud himself, reflecting on the question of thought transference or telepathy and its relation to the subject matter of psychoanalysis.

In accordance with the multi-directional mobility of a psyché, other essays point forward to themes in Derrida's later work. Several of the essays in this volume initiate the kind of political and conceptual analysis that became a prominent feature of Derrida's output from the end of the 1980s until his death in 2004. 'Geopsychoanalysis and "the rest of the world"' takes up the issue of human rights and their violation in parts of Latin America. 'Racism's Last Word,' published in 1983 is part of an art exhibition intended to become a travelling museum against Apartheid in South Africa. It combines geopolitical commentary with reflections on law, justice and democracy in the manner that is pursued further in 'The Laws of Reflection: Nelson Mandela, in Admiration' (published in Psyche Volume II) and 'Force of Law' and intensified in Spectres of Marx (1993) and Rogues (2003).

'The Deaths of Roland Barthes' is the first in a series of eulogies that Derrida wrote after the deaths of his contemporaries and friends including Paul De Man, Michel Foucault, Edmond Jabès, Louis Althusser, Louis Marin, Sarah Kofman, Gilles Deleuze, Emmanuel Levinas and Jean-François Lyotard among others (see The Work of Mourning, 2003). It inaugurates a new genre in Derrida's writing, one that involved writing, soon after their deaths, about people whom he had known. This was a genre that he had previously regarded as 'impossible, indecent and unjustifiable' (280). Fully cognizant of the intellectual, moral and phenomenological ambiguity of this manner of mourning, remembering and reinventing those whom he wanted to be known as his 'friends,' Derrida reinvents the ancient genre of the funeral ovation by combining theoretical reflections on the work of the deceased with personal reminiscences of his relation to the person. In the case of Barthes, this takes the form of an analysis of the opposition between the poignant (punctum) and the studied (studium) that frames his discussion of photographs in Camera Lucida. Derrida re-presents this contrast as an iteration of the opposition that informs much of his own work between the particular, unique or individual and the general, interchangeable or collective, all the while drawing out the relationship these have to the deaths of the writer, the subject of a given photograph or bearer of a given name.

A style of philosophical thinking and writing emerged in Britain in the 1950s that became known, no doubt misleadingly, as 'ordinary language' philosophy. In contrast, it would not be at all misleading to describe much of the work that appears in this collection as 'philosophical language' philosophy, if only because philosophical language is at once the raw material and the means of Derrida's intellectual production. The question of philosophical language is raised explicitly in 'Envoi' when he points out that the paradigmatically philosophical question, 'what is representation itself and in general,' is threatened by the fact that there is not one philosophical language but a whole series of such languages, between which more or less approximate equivalences have been established between words such as representatio, Vorstellung and représentation: 'This is not a problem of translation, it is the problem of translation' (101). Derrida provokes his audience of representatives of the French societies of philosophy by insisting on the importance of Heidegger's efforts to identify modernity as an epoch in the history of Being and by reminding them of a proposal, put forward in 1901 at a meeting of the French Society for Philosophy, to ban the word représentation from French philosophical vocabulary on the grounds that it was an illegitimate and unnecessary translation of the German Vorstellung. In stark contrast to the Gallocentric tenor of that proposal, Derrida wonders whether there is any such thing as a French philosophical language (118).

His own extraordinary facility with a variety of philosophical languages and techniques is fulsomely displayed in the essay that frames this collection, 'Psyche: Invention of the Other.' This is deconstruction as conceptual analysis of the most rigorous kind, applied here to the concept and status of invention. Traditionally, 'invention' refers to the coming of something new, something that is therefore other to what has gone before and that, 'at the moment when it comes about,' conforms to no pre-existing status or rule (24). At the same time, to the extent that an invention is able to be received into some pre-existing practice or institution, it must be legitimized by rules and procedures which are compatible with those already in existence. In this manner, an invention that is recognizable and receivable as such will always have been possible in accordance with those rules and procedures. Understood in this manner, an invention does not break with current institutions, laws or procedures. It does no more than make explicit that which was already possible within 'the economy of the same' (44). It follows that invention 'would be in conformity with its concept … only insofar as, paradoxically, invention invents nothing, when in invention the other does not come, and when nothing comes to the other or from the other' (44). In other words, an invention that did not break with existing institutional procedures would not really be an invention. An invention that really did invent something new would require the advent of something truly 'other.' It would require the coming about of something that did not fall within the existing space of the possible and was therefore strictly speaking impossible. In this manner, invention properly so called would involve the kind of experience of the impossible that Derrida later attributed to justice, friendship, hospitality and forgiveness.

Because of this concern with the advent of the truly other, 'Psyche: Invention of the Other' has widely been taken to have initiated a turn towards a more positive and politically engaged style of thinking: an affirmative rather than a purely negative deconstruction. It is here that Derrida announces that 'Deconstruction is inventive or it is nothing at all' (23). The conclusion of the analysis of invention outlined above shows how, at this point in its evolution, deconstruction is considered to be politically inventive, namely in so far as it opens up the present in order to allow the coming of the other or the new: deconstructive invention 'can consist only in opening, in uncloseting, destabilizing foreclusionary structures so as to allow for the passage toward the other' (45). 'Racism's Last Word' introduces another way in which deconstructive analysis would later be applied to political concepts, by contrasting political discourse and paintings. Where the former implies an inevitable and conditional engagement with a given state of force and law in the world, the silence of the pictures that make up the exhibition against Apartheid is unconditional: 'This silence calls out unconditionally; it keeps watch on what is not, on what is not yet …' (386).

Derrida's skill as a reader and critic of the languages of philosophy is also evident in the close reading of Levinas' texts undertaken in 'At This Very Moment in This Work Here I Am,' which unravels the sense in which the Other before whom we are supposed to be responsible turns out to be masculine and thus to exclude or at least to 'secondarize' the feminine. Or again in the careful untangling of the 'metaphors' of survival, generation and life in Walter Benjamin's description of the task of the translator in 'Des tours de Babel.' Derrida teases out in order to set apart the metaphorics of paternity and presence as well as the paradoxical and messianistic conception of language upon which Benjamin relies, elements of which may be found in the founding myth of linguistic diversity from which this essay derives its title. His discussion of the theoretical problems of translation begins with a demonstration of some of these in the multiple versions of the story of Babel. The fact that the title of the essay remains untranslated from the original French is a performative demonstration of the very untranslatability that results from the divine separation of human languages, the same event that also occasions the need for translation in the first place. 'Des tours de Babel' might be read as referring to both the 'towers' and the 'turns' or 'turnings' of 'Babel,' where this latter word is at once both a common noun and a proper name that is, as such, properly untranslatable.

Since it was first published in 1985, 'Des tours de Babel' should come at the end of the volume, in accordance with Derrida's claim in the Preface that he departs from chronological order only once in placing 'Psyche: Invention of the Other' (1984) at the beginning. In fact, this essay sits right at the halfway point of this collection, number eight out of sixteen chapters, which should have been occupied by 'Psyche: Invention of the Other.' If we suppose that this placement is not arbitrary and that the Author's Preface deliberately obfuscates its significance, then we might suspect that 'Des tours de Babel' provides the axis around which the mirror turns. This essay is the real focus, the punctum or imaginary point, about which turn all of the reflections here gathered into one body of work: reflections on translation, the subject and subjects, the language and languages of philosophy.