Psychiatry and Philosophy of Science

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Rachel Cooper, Psychiatry and Philosophy of Science, Acumen, 2007, 197pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780773533875.

Reviewed by Grant Gillett, University of Otago


This is a very competent introduction to the overlap between philosophy of science and analytic philosophy of psychiatry. It deals with the traditional questions and the standard approaches to philosophy of science and canvasses many of the current positions on the subject under four main heads: (i) the contested subject matter of psychiatry, (ii) the modes of explanation employed by psychiatry, (iii) the multiple different theoretical frameworks that inform psychiatric practice, and (iv) the role of values and interests in psychiatry.

The first major issue discussed is the relevance of natural kinds to psychiatric illness and the author gives a succinct summary of the various approaches including critical-realist or scientific realist, essentialist and Aristotelian accounts. Cooper somewhat brusquely dismisses the latter two whereas one could argue that a modified Aristotelian position developing the idea of an unfolding form and formal causation is rather suited to current dynamic systems work in biological theory and therefore to contemporary philosophy of biomedical science. The dismissal of essentialist accounts also seems a mite too quick in that the author focuses on identical essential properties rather than a more dynamic idea of real essence (as might be gained from Locke, for instance) whereby one seeks to limn the aspects of a type of being that maintain it as a stable "kind" in a milieu of intersecting relevantly explanatory forces (such as causal and/or selection forces). Such an account would then provide a much more useful unifying explanatory framework for Cooper's "messy account" of mental disorders as human kinds. On her account a disorder is such if (i) it is a bad thing for standard members of the species, (ii) it is maladaptive in the particular setting where the sufferer is located -- the "unlucky" condition, and (iii) it is treatable by recognisably medical means. But this approach does not really do justice to the complex interaction between fittingness in a world of meaning and fittingness in a world of causality that is required to understand the particular kind of un-fittingness that is a mental disorder. Given the unique position of human beings as natural denizens of a significantly symbolic life-world (and therefore subject to multiple determinants arising in the orders of discourse, interpersonal reality, social structure, and biology) much is required of the philosophy of psychiatry and its classifications. The contested nature of psychiatry is eminently understandable on that basis alone.

Cooper's account stays within the ethos of the traditional empiricist, naturalist and reductive ontologies whose metaphysics she should be wary of in that they are relatively inhospitable to Dupre, Hacking, and their ilk whom she quotes with some approval but dresses in her somewhat restrictive philosophical garb. In her use of Hacking she portrays his argument as one that depends on the feedback between our conceptions or practices and the phenomenon that is being cast as a kind, but Hacking's argument is more radical. I take him to be making the claim that, unlike a natural kind the real essence of which is fixed by laws of nature operating independently of human conceptions of what the world is like, conditions of the psyche are in part constituted by the conceptions of those who have them. As a result, conditions of the psyche cannot be studied totally as phenomena whose nature is fixed by (physical) nature but must be acknowledged to be phenomena in part determined within the human world of meaning. When the situated individual is seen as a being whose adaptation to or fit in the human life-world is dynamically negotiated in relation to a culturally defined reality, then any kind of (predominantly) biological construal of what is going on is doomed to fail. Thus the ecological niches of mental illness inhabit a liminal space where a number of cultural interests and configurations both define the niche and create the pressures that induce people to exhibit a state of being that fits that niche. Admittedly Cooper's acknowledgment of the particular situation of the affected individual doffs the cap towards an account that acknowledges narrative and situated subjectivity as the ground in which mental illness can take root but it is unclear that she has the metaphysical underpinning to support that concession so that the sense of "real" in play in her analysis remains ambiguous. This crucial unclarity undermines some of the points made in the discussion of natural kinds despite the useful connections Cooper makes between the prevalence of so-called "objective" or standardized taxonomies and the vested interests that control the current psychiatric episteme.

A discussion that takes aim at the present in terms of interests and the power-knowledge relations that structure contemporary biomedical debate in general must acknowledge Foucault, and Cooper does. But, in dealing with Foucault, the author's lack of familiarity with structuralism (and therefore post-structuralism) is rather on show so that she misses the nuances of Foucault's post-structuralist reading of the nature of mental illness. Those nuances would be highly useful in relating paradigms which approach the data of clinical experience quite differently in that the idea of the touch of, or encounter with, "the real" (here the reality of the patient's suffering and the schism between meaning and subjectivity at the heart of the patient's experience) is of central importance in clinical psychiatry. A focus on the patient as a creature who is a product of the mirror world (the domain of meaning) and being-in-the-(actual) world allows one to pursue clues found in the patient's presentation and response to therapy that tap into the "verstehen or narrative understanding" (81) identified by Cooper as a key to the collaborative work of treatment and rehabilitation jointly conducted by differently oriented professionals.

The relation between our shared interactions with the world and our multiple paradigms in the psychological or human sciences does bring us close to a key issue that emerges from the work of Kant, Frege, Wittgenstein, and McDowell in that co-reference (and indeed the co-feeling that lies at the heart of moral development) offers us a way of learning to track the truth and inter-translate between discourses that transcends the standard analytic fare in empiricist (and post-empiricist) accounts of mind and world (121). Unfortunately Cooper's metaphysical naivety resurfaces in the discussion of the significance of accounts of mind for the understanding of theory in psychiatry and the reader is not provided with a well-developed account of subjectivity as essentially embodied and cast into the contingencies of a brute causal world somewhat intractable to the requirements of meaning-making. The resulting tension (between a world of meaning and a surd actuality) creates the discontents to which the mind is prone, whether because of its own internal failings or because of the inhospitable nature of its context as a place in which one can develop a sustainable and liveable life story. Cooper notices the ambiguities of the human situation but does not diagnose them clearly enough to sharpen the rest of her discussion.

One symptom of her brush with serious metaphysics and philosophical logic is her use of the causal theory of reference to try to analyse what is happening in a case study when different professionals converge on an opinion about a patient's diagnosis and management. The underlying thought is surely correct but its philosophical drag is not perspicuous in that the synthesis of a case is not caused by the person at the centre of the picture (or should we say, hologram) but is provoked by or produced by that person as he or she is interacted with by the diversely persuaded professionals who have to get to grips with the phenomena they are confronting and try to discern the truth about the living being presenting him- or herself to them. To be fair, Cooper appreciates the point (despite the inadequate semantics) and notices the theory-ladenness of the observations being made but, limited by an inadequate semantics, she has nowhere to turn but the "old (realist) saw" of causality. Again, it is churlish to chastise her for a mistake that eminent figures in philosophical logic and the philosophy of language commit willy-nilly all over the shop.

Cooper finishes the book on a strong note by grappling with the partial and interested nature of medical research in general and psychiatric research in particular and registers both succinctly and tellingly the unhealthy role that the biomedical industry plays in many areas of contemporary practice and thinking. This is a timely discussion that would be deepened immeasurably by the critical apparatus of thinkers such as Foucault or Deleuze, but there is time enough in the future for this thinker to go where those paths might lead her from her very sound start in the subject.

Cooper's summary of her work testifies to her intellectual status in the lively debate about (and application of) values to clinical practice and theory with its well-grounded acknowledgement of the situated thinker in the growth of knowledge. I am sure that her academic pedigree will stand her in good stead in any future explorations of the contested overlap of scientific, phenomenological, and clinical thinking in psychiatry.