Psychiatry in the Scientific Image

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Dominic Murphy, Psychiatry in the Scientific Image, MIT Press, 2006, 400pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0262134551.

Reviewed by John M. Doris, and Sarah Robins, Washington University in St. Louis


The history of psychiatry invites skepticism. In the 19th century, American slaves attempting to escape were diagnosed with Drapetomania, which practitioners carefully distinguished from dyesthaesia Aethiopica, a diagnosis for slaves who were insufficiently concerned with owners' property rights. Such examples of prejudice cloaked in pseudo-science are regrettably common in the history of psychiatric medicine, common enough to provoke denials that there is such a thing as mental illness (e.g., Szasz 1987). Yet we embrace such a general skepticism at our peril -- and the peril of those who suffer. Depression, for example, is a widespread and life-threatening affliction, estimated by the World Health Organization to be the 4th leading cause of productivity loss worldwide.[1] Developing a scientifically reputable nosology -- a taxonomy for the classification of mental disorders -- requires distinguishing the depressions from the drapetomanias.

It is this task to which Dominic Murphy's challenging and important new book, Psychiatry in the Scientific Image, is dedicated. As the title intimates, the book attempts to situate philosophy of psychiatry within contemporary philosophy of science, and psychiatry itself within the boundaries of a scientific worldview. Murphy's (p. 21) central concern is to defend a "revisionist objectivism" regarding psychiatric nosology.  According to Murphy (chapter 6), recent developments in cognitive neuroscience present the materials for a credible "more or less realist" (p. 209) nosology, although its development will require extensive departure from commonsense understandings of mental illness.

As might be expected from a work displaying close familiarity with discussions in clinical theory and practice, the book has a decidedly "insider" feel to it. Like much contemporary work in the philosophies of the special sciences, there's a lot of special science here, but unlike some work of this kind, there's also a lot of philosophy. For example, Murphy's treatment of the science results in shrewd observations about what makes a given condition a disorder, an historically central problematic in medical ethics, and about what (if anything) makes a given condition mental, an historically central problematic in the philosophy of mind. Most importantly, Murphy's revisionist objectivism develops a fertile blueprint for reorienting psychiatric nosology, and the tools he brings to bear also serve to further discussion of persistent difficulties in the philosophy of science, particularly worries about realism and levels of explanation. Taken altogether, Psychiatry in the Scientific Image is an exemplary piece of work in the philosophy of the special sciences, advancing thinking in both the philosophy and the science. Given the special science in question, it is also a major contribution to the philosophies of psychology and mind. It is not often that one sees a book with such broad resonance.

Murphy's (pp. 61, 317) project is animated by provocative claims to the effect that psychiatry's current demarcation of mental disorders is scientifically uninteresting and of limited clinical utility. The difficulty, according to Murphy, is that modern psychiatry serves two masters; it is viewed simultaneously as a branch of scientific medicine and as a body of normative assessment regarding human flourishing. Traditionally, psychiatry has sought to manage this divide by endorsing a "two-stage" model of mental disorder, which attempts to segregate descriptive assessment of departures from normal functioning and evaluative assessment of deviations from ideals of well-functioning. According to this model, we first determine what counts as normal functioning for a cognitive system, and then determine which departures from these norms should be demarcated as mental illness and targeted for treatment and control. It is now something of a philosophical truism that descriptive and normative considerations are not readily disentangled, if at all (Railton 2003; Doris and Stich 2005), and this alone might be enough to dampen optimism for the two-stage model. The difficulty for psychiatry is exacerbated by its adherence to a folk conception of mental illness where descriptive and normative considerations are often hopelessly muddled and, perhaps relatedly, psychiatric researchers' limited success in developing the sort of causal explanations that typify productive scientific inquiry.

Murphy thinks the two-stage approach is salvageable -- but only if psychiatry is divested of folk categorizations of mental illness, and begins to develop causal explanations of its myriad disorders. He thus remains committed to the possibility of a scientific approach to mental illness; this is the objectivist component of his revisionist objectivism. His approach is revisionist because the set of mental disorders is identified by cognitive neuroscience, not by our everyday understanding. In fact, he claims that psychiatry should be viewed as clinical cognitive neuroscience: "it stands to the biology of the human brain as cardiology stands to the biology of the human circulatory system" (p. 93). As cognitive neuroscience continues to give us more information as to how the mind/brain functions, we can pick out further disorders representing breakdowns of cognitive systems. This is why cortical blindness, as a perceptual disorder, counts as a mental illness as much as schizophrenia, a motor planning and thought disorder, does. Once the class of potential disorders is cleaved from commonsense judgments about well-functioning, the concerns about medically sanctioned prejudices that have clouded the history of psychiatry can -- one hopes -- be ameliorated.

Yet Murphy's approach retains a space for the sort of socially negotiated normative judgments that characterize earlier renderings of the two-stage model.[2] For example, Murphy (p. 98) leaves open the question of whether "gourmand syndrome," a sequela of certain brain lesions where patients become obsessed with the minutiae of fine dining, counts as an undesirable dysfunction for which someone should be treated. (As well he might: one suspects that life in many parts of the world would be made more pleasant by an epidemic of such lesioning!) According to Murphy:

Mental disorder is a concept like pest, weed, or vermin. Weeds and vermin are not natural kinds, but they are made up of natural kinds that can be explained empirically. Furthermore, whether something counts as a weed or a vermin depends on human interests in a way that allows the class to grow over time, or vary across projects… Concepts that are sensitive to human interests in this way are open-ended -- things may fall into them (or drop out of them) as human interests change over time. Folk thinking does not determine in advance whether a species is a pest, nor does it make scientific investigation of a species of pest into a normative endeavor. (pp. 98-99)

Of course, it is for just this sort of reason that psychiatry appears to exemplify the commingling of fact and value that bedevils aspirations to scientific realism. If we allow historical and cultural variation regarding what falls under the purview of a scientific concept, then -- the worry goes -- we lose traction on the claim that our scientific posits can be thought to track -- in some sense needing to be made good -- "objective reality." Murphy's endorsement of a revised two-stage model shows this argument to be unmotivated, at least in its application to psychiatry. The term mental disorder may not pick out anything that resembles a natural kind, and further, what fits in the category may fluctuate over time. But neither of these facts makes trouble about the reality of mental illness; the psychiatrist is not driven to skepticism about mental illness, anymore than the agriculturalist is driven to skepticism about pests, vermin, and weeds. Murphy's arguments thus offer the promise of navigating the conflicting pressures of realist and anti-realist intuitions about psychiatry. In this way, his discussion serves as a paradigm for addressing general anxieties about realism: for example, it cautions against too closely associating realism about a subject with demands that its subject matter be taxonomized in terms of natural kinds. Murphy's arguments also highlight an important methodological lesson: debates about realism are most likely to be most fruitful -- if fruitful they may be -- when situated amongst the details of a particular field of inquiry.

Psychiatry gains its realist credentials, Murphy claims, when it begins to incorporate causal explanations. The search for the most perspicuous causal explanation is not infrequently construed as a search for the appropriate "level" of explanation, where the appropriate level is the "lowest-level" explanation, and the lowest level explanation is the explanation involving the smallest parts. In the case of cognitive phenomena, the lowest level of explanation is often taken to be molecular neuroscience, which explains mental processes in terms of activities at the sub cellular level. Murphy's requirement that psychiatry provide causal explanations might thus be taken as a reductivist claim, stipulating that all mental disorders should be explained in terms of gene transcription, protein synthesis, biochemical cascades, and the like. But Murphy resists what Wilson (2004: 22) calls "smallism": the conviction that explanations invoking smaller or "lower level" entities -- the smaller the better -- are somehow more "basic" than those invoking larger or "higher level" entities. Murphy denies that the best level of explanation should be equated with the lowest level of explanation. On Murphy's (p. 141) view, explanations succeed not by proceeding at a particular level, but by supporting a sufficient degree of "robustness"; an explanation of a mental disorder is robust when it accounts for the presence or absence of the disorder across a variety of individual and environmental contexts. For instance, the explanation of Huntington's disease in terms of the huntingtin gene robustly explains the incidence of this disorder not because the explanation involves genes, but because the presence of the gene is adequate to explain each occurrence of the disease. While such low-level explanations are particularly good at providing robustness, they will not be the only robust explanations (p. 133). Further, Murphy (p. 141) denies that explanations in psychiatry will typically achieve robustness by fixating at one level, instead endorsing an explanatory pluralism. For example, whether or not someone develops major depression is determined by a combination of factors at a variety of levels, including (but not limited to) that person's genetic predisposition for the affliction and present life circumstances. Most mental illnesses are more like major depression than Huntington's: they admit of a great degree of variability across individual and environmental factors. Thus, explanations in psychiatry must reflect the existence of a variety of interacting, nonfundamental causes that span all of the subfields engaged in cognitive neuroscience.

Striking the balance needed for Murphy's (p. 209) "more or less realist" understanding of mental disorders will be a delicate undertaking: famously, developing a view that is "just realist enough" is no straightforward task. The way forward might therefore seem uncertain, but the fecundity of Murphy's proposals is illustrated by their resonance with trends in contemporary psychiatry, such as James Blair and colleagues' (2005) recent account of psychopathy. Blair et al.'s (2005: 12-13) account is developed around a differentiation between reactive and instrumental aggression: reactive aggression is provoked aggression, as in fighting back when someone tries to steal your chocolate cupcakes, while instrumental aggression is unprovoked aggression committed for the sake of achieving one's aims, as in deciding to steal someone's cupcakes for an afternoon snack. Many individuals display reactive aggression, but psychopaths engage in instrumental aggression much more frequently than do normals. Decoupling two forms of aggression traditionally understood as expressions of a single symptom enables more fine-grained diagnoses of psychopathy and related conditions, such as antisocial personality disorder; on this view, not all clinically significant patterns of aggression are symptomatic of psychopathy. This approach is bolstered by neuroscientific evidence; recent findings indicate that the propensity for each form of aggression stems from different neural pathways (Blair et al. 2005: chapter 7). With this evidence in hand, Blair and colleagues develop a two-stage model of the sort advocated by Murphy. At stage one, we find that deficiencies in the neural pathway through the amygdala responsible for instrumental learning and empathetic engagement with others demarcate the set of individuals who are candidates for a diagnosis of psychopathy (Blair et al. 2005: chapter 8). At stage two, we find that this neural condition will typically be manifested as a disorder only in those individuals whose environments provoke instrumental aggression. For example, pressures to instrumental aggression likely vary with the economic and social means one has available, and by social pressures for or against such behavior: if the wrong amagdyla winds up in the right neighborhood, so to speak, the brain deficiency may never eventuate in the behaviors symptomatic of psychopathy (Blair et al. 2005: 37-8).  The Blair group's approach therefore seems to instantiate Murphy's philosophical program; in as much as the approach is theoretically and (perhaps eventually) clinically fertile, philosophers of psychiatry have good reason to follow Murphy's lead.

The revisionist objectivism Murphy develops offers a promising approach to restructuring psychiatric nosology in a way that is compatible with what has been learned in cognitive neuroscience and philosophy of science. Yet, as Murphy himself rightly notes, the book offers a preliminary treatment of these issues, not their resolution. Key puzzles remain; for instance, implementing Murphy's explanatory pluralism may oftentimes be dauntingly complex, especially in as much as explanantia drawn from different levels may indicate conflicting etiologies. What Murphy has given us is an outline for reforming psychiatry in light of the best going sciences of mind and brain. Given the richness of his suggestions, Psychiatry in the Scientific Image represents a significant advance for the philosophy of psychiatry, and a striking example of how philosophy of the special sciences should be done.[3]


Blair, J., Mitchell, D., & Blair, K. 2005. The Psychopath: Emotion and the Brain. Oxford: Blackwell Publishing.

Doris, J. M., & Stich, S. P. 2005. "As a Matter of Fact: Empirical Perspectives on Ethics." In F. Jackson and M. Smith (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Contemporary Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Railton, P. 2003. Facts, Values, and Norms: Essays Toward a Morality of Consequence. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Szasz, T. 1987. Insanity. New York: Wiley.

Wilson, R. A. 2004. Boundaries of the Mind: The Individual in the Fragile Sciences. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.



[2] Murphy acknowledges that deficits of rationality, which frequently occur in mental disorders, problematize the two-stage model's demarcation of scientific and normative assessment. Chapter 5 is dedicated to this issue; Murphy there argues that naturalized approaches to rationality can avoid the difficulty.

[3] Coauthors are listed alphabetically. Thanks to Kelly Roe for helpful comments on the penultimate draft.