Psychoanalysis in a New Light

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Gunnar Karlsson, Psychoanalysis in a New Light, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 209pp, $34.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521122443.

Reviewed by Sara Beardsworth, Southern Illinois University Carbondale


Karlsson's book redefines the significance and purpose of psychoanalysis from a phenomenological perspective that conceives of psychoanalysis as a science (searching for truth) and "not merely as a method of treatment." His purpose is "to discuss the domain and conditions of psychoanalysis theoretically rather than from the perspective of clinical experience." This project is clearly executed with helpful chapter summaries along the way. Overall, it casts a powerful phenomenological searchlight upon the couch, levering the intelligibility of psychoanalytic theory off from dependence on its own empirical moment, the practice. We will consider the major fruits of this endeavor before questioning its risks.

Four specific objectives can be discerned in Karlsson's book: to ground psychoanalysis as a science phenomenologically, to present the Freudian subject as a temporalizing subject whose original striving is the striving for existence, to integrate narrative truth and historical truth in psychoanalysis, and to establish the function of self-consciousness in the analytic setting.

The first objective is to ground psychoanalysis as a science phenomenologically by giving it a meaning ground in the life-world. This is carried out in opposition to the "supposed development" of a neuropsychoanalysis. By returning psychoanalysis to the cultural crucible, the phenomenological approach indeed restores the fitting basis of the emergence and development of psychoanalysis as a discourse. At the same time, the phenomenological grounding carries out an "objectification" of the psyche, turning psychical processes into objective ones. Following Husserl's method of achieving a "pure structure" in relation to the natural sciences, the phenomenological application renders Freud's conceptions of the unconscious as "idealized, theoretical constructions." Idealization is achieved through abstraction from sexual experiences in the life-world. That is to say, in grounding psychoanalysis in the life-world, Freud's libido concept is taken to be a radicalization of certain characteristics of "experienced" sexuality. These are introduced in contrast to a primary level of being in the world furnished by Heidegger. In "readiness-to-hand" -- the phenomenological-existential notion of an original, practical, future-oriented, instrumental way of being in the world -- the objects of our tasks (equipment) are not themselves thematized. They "present themselves first of all as possibilities to fulfill intentions and satisfy wishes" and have an internal reference to a "totality" of equipment. Heidegger's purpose was to establish a primary level of being in a "hermeneutical-existential" rather than theoretical understanding. Merleau-Ponty adds to this that understanding is rooted in pre-reflective body experience in our concernful dealing in the world.

Karlsson then sets out four characteristics of pre-scientific or "experienced" sexuality in contrast to the pre-reflective body experience. Sexuality is thematic (rather than non-thematized), intrinsic (rather than instrumental, since pleasure is for its own sake), focused on now-time (rather than future-oriented), and gravitates toward the unbound (rather than belonging to a totality). Freud's conceptions of the unconscious are then presented as a radicalization of these characteristics. The pleasure principle, Nirvana principle, the principle of free energy, primary process, and the id are idealized theoretical constructions. The development of Freud's own thought supports this. His conceptions of the unconscious became "frontier concepts, which do not refer to phenomenal, experiential entities." Above all, the libido concept goes from being a descriptive and phenomenal concept to one that describes something unconscious, and eventually acquires "a more constructed character." This view is underlined by the fact that the aetiological significance of neuroses cannot be limited to "observations" in Freud's clinical practice. Here we witness the levering of psychoanalytic theory off from dependence on its own practice. The resulting objectification of the psyche is later undermined by returning these theoretical constructions to the analytic setting.

The second objective restores the Freudian subject as a temporalizing subject whose basic striving is the affirmation of existence. The affirmation of existence is "original" and makes the experience of existence possible. This is a particularly productive line of thought that could play a role in connecting moments in a wide range of psychoanalytic theory, which does appear to be the Karlsson's hope. (For example, the affirmation of existence -- which "is not necessarily about the outer world" but whose concept "also entails an experience of an inner constancy, endurance, and gestalt" -- could find connections with the Kleinian "phantasy," Winnicott's transitional object, and Kristeva's view of symbol formation.) Beyond this, the idea of the affirmation of existence serves as a reminder that psychoanalysis is not least a propadeutic in learning how to live. We return to it below.

Karlsson's third objective concerns the nature of truth claims in psychoanalysis. In the increasingly widespread "narrative" perspective the construction of a coherent story that makes up a meaningful whole gains an epistemological significance in the analytic setting, as befits its character as a search for meaning. However, as narrative becomes a truth value, confusion arises over its relation to historical truth in psychoanalysis: the reconstruction of a past embedded in the present. Karlsson avoids choosing between the "naïve epistemological realism" of mere reconstruction and the threat of relativism that shadows narrative truth, and of dehistoricizing psychoanalysis by removing the analysand from the relation to their past. He concludes that historical truth enters in with the breaks in the coherence of storytelling in free association. The force of history has the storytelling refer back to the past. This also undermines the aforementioned objectification of the psyche since the theoretical constructions are appropriated by the psychoanalytic process itself.

The fourth and final objective is to correct inadequate attention in psychoanalysis to consciousness. This is not only a matter of the phenomenological notion of conscious intending, for Karlsson underscores the radical distinction of conscious and unconscious in Freud, finding that psychoanalysis can become a scientific "explanation" of ego-alien sexuality beyond phenomenological descriptions, which tellingly lack much treatment of sexuality. The psychoanalytic attitude toward consciousness is, for Karlsson, more a problem of disregarding a "function" of self-consciousness in the analytic setting itself, which is most succinctly expressed as the capacity for symbolizing.

In order to draw out some major fruits of this enterprise, we now focus on the second line of thought, which is a phenomenological application of time to Freud's idea of the "binding of energy." Since this pertains to the most enigmatic conception of the Freudian unconscious -- drive energy -- any light that phenomenology can throw on it must be welcome. Karlsson does this by singling out a "contradiction" in two meanings of the death drive in Freud's Beyond the Pleasure Principle. The first meaning is the binding of energy itself, ascribed here to the death drive because Freud's essay introduces the latter first in respect of clinical and everyday phenomena of the compulsion to repeat. The binding drive is first of all -- and ultimately, for Karlsson -- what is "beyond" the pleasure principle since the compulsion to repeat aims at a retrospective binding of energy to allow for control over the traumatic or unpleasurable event/stimuli. Only after this can the pleasure principle come into operation through discharge of libido. Discharge is now the other meaning of the death drive, in line with the Nirvana principle of reducing excitation in the mental apparatus to (the asymptotic point of) zero. Karlsson follows Laplanche in having the death drive be the "most untamed and uncivilized" drive in the libido, its "bottom layer," subject to primary processes. This second meaning -- discharge -- contradicts the first and is taken to be the only characteristic that actually qualifies for the concept of death drive. Its opposite, the binding of energy is "beyond" (in the sense of prior to) the pleasure principle. This allows for the theoretical establishment of an original striving for existence, which does away with the idea of an "original" striving toward death. What reveals this is the application of the phenomenological notion of time.

Following Merleau-Ponty, the subject and time are structurally identical. Each transcends or goes beyond itself in an openness to past and future. With Husserl, the inner time consciousness or temporalization of the subject is an ecstatic unity with the structure of a primal impression in which retention and protention are enclosed. That is to say, the primal impression encloses both the retaining of what has just been and the announcing of the expectation of what is about to come. The phenomenological example is hearing a tone that endures in an auditory experience. The flow of acts of consciousness that synthesize or harmonize with one another is itself required for the experience of existence. For Karlsson, then, "to bind energy, to incorporate something in the mental apparatus, to experience, can be said to presuppose this kind of temporalization." Binding energy can be understood in terms of an original affirmation of existence, which makes the experience of existence possible.

The thought of temporalization also reaccommodates the later dualistic theory of the drive. Although enclosed in the primal impression, retention and protention each correlate to something absent insofar as temporalization is a binding of the present and the absent. Specific to protention is "the entailment of a future horizon pointing to a final Absence, so a present absence bearing the possibility of a radically different Absence, death, whose essence is termination of the subject's temporalization." Death as an ultimate absence must be understood as the "breach" of existence. Although an inscrutable existential termination whose meaning eludes understanding, death nonetheless shows itself as final Absence, "given as Nothingness," in anxiety (Heidegger). The countermove to death, in the binding of energy, consists of "letting the subject's intending attach itself to an object, which soothes by providing the subject with an affirmation of the experience of existence." It is the subject's way of "fighting back" Nothingness. Rounding out this application of phenomenological time to psychoanalysis, Karlsson underlines that, psychologically speaking, the synthesis of time can be anything from the earliest child experiences to "higher," more developed narratives. In traumatic events time is frozen and storytelling has ceased. The compulsion to repeat may therefore be an attempt to work through and incorporate traumatic events. It is a "common claim" that incorporation of traumatic events in a narrative is an essential moment in the psychoanalytic treatment. The phenomenological application of time to Freud's idea of binding energy has restored the life and death drives as genuine contraries: binding of energy/synthesis of time/affirmation of existence opposes discharge of energy/dissolution of the synthesis of time/the libido. On this view, it is sexuality that can acquire the annihilating character known from psychotic states. As the most untamed "bottom layer" of the libido the death drive is the tendency of dissolution.

We now come to the risks entailed in replacing psychoanalytic method, in which theory and practice are not severed, with phenomenological method. They can be approached by elaborating further on the notion of death drive as dissolution of the synthesis of time. Taken as the unbinding drive in contrast to the binding of energy, rather than teleogically in terms of the Nirvana principle, the death drive operates not in discharge but in the withdrawal of a part of the psyche from time. An excitation or memory-trace held apart from the primary processes is "beyond" the pleasure principle. From the perspective of lived experience, death is a breach in temporalization. This is consistent with the freezing of time and cessation of storytelling in trauma. Psychosis indicates the incremental removal of parts of the psyche from time. This notion of the death drive therefore corresponds to the most radical sense of Freud's thought of the "timeless" (Zeitlos).

On this view, death is not inscribed within the phenomenological orientation to possibility but is, rather, the limit of phenomenological or subjective time. Nor does this simply leave us with an abstract opposition between time and the timeless. Psychoanalysis can question how a biological conception of death rethought in this way as the timeless -- "the time of death" -- is both psychical and existential: the "scandalon of the timeless" (Kristeva). For this, we return to a central notion of the psychoanalytic process itself, "working through" (Durcharbeitung), not all of which enters into consciousness. In working through a "gap" in consciousness -- something missing in the make-up of personal history -- can become something sensed as "shifted" in respect of an experience that enters in a peculiar way into expressible, conscious reality. Something like a memory but with a hallucinatory quality telescopes with the time of remembering and has, for the analysand, the quality of evidence, "truth." This suggests that working through is a crossroads of time and the timeless. It also returns us to the relational and emotional context of psychoanalysis. The presence of an "other" (the analyst) -- more specifically, the countertransference in the method of listening -- may be felt as resonance with the striving for existence. Given the transference -- onto this "object" (resonance) -- working through then makes the affirmation of existence possible. Thus in psychoanalytic method a light emanates from the couch, even in respect of what shuts light down.

The first risk in setting that method aside, then, is the submergence of this light under phenomenology's powerful searchlight. Second, there may be something premature, however desirable, about the attempt to integrate psychoanalytic concepts and, more widely, to ground psychoanalysis as a science. Just as a certain radical and unframeable dependence on an other makes of psychoanalysis a propadeutic in learning how to live, so it also suggests a kind of limit of knowledge. The development of psychoanalytic knowledge even depends to some degree upon a tolerance for inconsistencies. The "epistemological, legitimizing function" that the grounding ambition is held to fulfill is questioned by a dialectical moment -- introducing the fissure of inconsistency -- when psychoanalytic concept formation remains tied to psychoanalytic experience. Third, the dialectical moment seems to be necessary to the capacity of psychoanalysis to contribute to a critical standpoint when the encounter with forms of suffering leads into an inquiry into the limits and limitations of our historical, social, and symbolic world. The investigation, for example, into how drive energies come further under the spell of rationalized reason and society, as analyzed by early "critical theory," might need to be continued. In sum, the theoretical achievement that comes from removing the Freudian subject from the relational and emotional context of psychoanalytic experience may lend itself to the dehistoricization of psychoanalysis itself. Levering the intelligibility of psychoanalysis off from its practice may then unwittingly fall in with the unbinding tendency: removing parts of the psyche from time … It would at least be interesting to see phenomenology consider the idea of death in psychoanalysis as a breach in subjective time.