Psychologie, Seiendes, Phantasie bei Franz Brentano

Psychologie Seiendes Phantasie Bei Franz Brentano

Ion Tănăsescu, Psychologie, Seiendes, Phantasie bei Franz Brentano, de Gruyter, 2022, 514pp., $126.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783110523782.

Reviewed by Robin D. Rollinger, The Institute of Philosophy of the Czech Academy of Sciences


In this book the author examines three aspects of Franz Brentano’s early philosophical endeavor. Part I is concerned with Brentano’s dissertation on the manifold meanings of “being” in relation to Martin Heidegger’s philosophical endeavor. Part II is an elaboration on Brentano’s project initiated in his Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint (1874),[1] whereas Part III (the final part) is particularly concerned with the relation between Brentano and Edmund Husserl with respect to the analysis of imagination.

All of these parts are of considerable interest to the historian of philosophy and psychology of the late nineteenth century. In recent decades it has become undeniably obvious that Brentano was one of the most influential philosophers in the twentieth century and indeed continues to be of great interest in our time. Phenomenology in particular exhibits his influence, primarily because Husserl developed his analysis of consciousness out of the descriptive psychology that he had learned from Brentano’s lectures (1884–1885). Moreover, Martin Heidegger repeatedly said that he was initially prompted to reflect on the question of Being through his youthful encounter with Brentano’s dissertation, a work that was written in 1862. Parts I and III are accordingly of interest to a broad range of scholars and philosophers, especially in connection with phenomenology or the so-called phenomenological movement.

As the present reviewer is much more competent to examine Parts II and III, an assessment of Tănăsescu’s examination of Brentano’s influence on Heidegger will not be attempted here. The closing section of Part I (139–149), however, does not concern itself with this matter, as its focus is a contrast of Brentano’s dissertation with a contemporaneous theologian’s advocacy for drawing upon the work of Thomas Aquinas in the understanding of Aristotle. While this theologian (identified as F. P. von Morgott) expresses himself in an extremely ideological manner, Brentano does not do so, as his objective in drawing upon Thomas Aquinas’ commentaries is to bring a systematic order into the doctrine of the categories. Indeed, Brentano continued to express his appreciation for Aquinas in this respect long after he severed all ecclesial ties.

The title of Tănăsescu’s book is unfortunately misleading, for one might expect from such a title an examination of Brentano’s late metaphysics, which is usually discussed under the heading of “reism.” This metaphysics and its concomitant psychology (a psychology with a soul from its very outset) are very different from his philosophical orientation in the nineteenth century. It would be beneficial to the reader if there were at least a subtitle to indicate that Tănăsescu is actually concerned only with early Brentano. There is of course nothing wrong with such a restriction. In view of the fact that the most influential figures among his students (not only Husserl, but also Carl Stumpf, Anton Marty, Alexius Meinong, Christian von Ehrenfels, and Kasimir Twardowski) drew on his early work and were either uninformed about his reism or even critical of it, the book under discussion here is quite well justified in its restriction. Nevertheless, the potential reader needs to know in advance what the range of material is to be discussed.

Tănăsescu’s examination of Brentano’s early philosophy is for the most part extremely well informed. Not only does he take into account published works that are often neglected in the literature on Brentano, but he also draws from materials among Brentano’s unpublished manuscripts. Of considerable importance here are lecture notes for metaphysics (M 96), notes for the continuation of the Psychology (Ps 53), and the lecture notes on selected questions from psychology and metaphysics (Ps 78). More will be said about this material below. Tănăsescu also makes good use of materials that the present reviewer has cited and commented on at considerable length (Rollinger 2012).

There are three different “levels” (Ebenen) of Brentano’s Psychology, according to Tănăsescu’s. First of all, he discerns “the Aristotelian-scholastic level, which finds expression concerning the dignity of the psychical object, the question of immortality . . . , intentionality, inner consciousness or the law of founding . . . ” (241).[2] By the “law of founding” (Fundierungsgestz) Tănăsescu means the thesis that a psychical act is either a presentation (Vorstellung) or founded on a presentation (381). It is possible to add to this list of Aristotle-inspired theories in Brentano’s Psychology, especially if we take into account the manuscript in which Brentano attempted to continue the work. For example, as Aristotle classifies the “sensed object” or “sensible” (aisthéton) into three classes, Brentano does as well (Ps 53/53029). We say that we see white, for instance. This object is a special sensible, for white can only be an object of sight. When we say that we see sugar, however, the fact that this object has a quality, namely sweetness, which we cannot see, but can only taste, makes it an accidental sensible. Finally, we can discern the size or shape an object through sight and touch. In this case the sensed object is a common sensible. Unfortunately, Tănăsescu does not draw as much as he should from the continuation of Brentano’s Psychology in manuscript.

The second level is “the Cartesian level to which the thesis of inner perception, the distinction of inner and outer perception, and the stark contrast between the world of psychical and physical phenomena give expression” (241). Tănăsescu is indeed entirely correct in identifying a Cartesian aspect of Brentano’s Psychology.

The third level is the “positive” one, very much tied to Auguste Comte and John Stuart Mill (242). Tănăsescu is again right to find this in Brentano’s psychology. Yet, as this is hardly more than an appreciation of induction as a method, Brentano is not distinct from the leaders of other psychological currents of his time, certainly not from Wilhelm Wundt, who was most successful in convincing the world of the scientific character of psychology.

While these three aspects are certainly to be found in Brentano’s main psychological work, it is unclear why Tănăsescu speaks of levels here, for they are not ordered. Be this as it may, they are not always identified by scholars.

Before entering into a consideration of Part III of Tanasecu’s book, a further point should be made regarding his usage of unpublished materials in M 96. These mainly consist of lecture notes from Brentano’s Würzburg period. Their topics are transcendental philosophy and ontology, the first two parts of metaphysics. These early notes do not contain treatments of the rest of metaphysics, theology and cosmology. Tănăsescu, while aware that transcendental philosophy is for Brentano an apologetic against skeptics and critics (Apologetik gegen Skeptiker und Kritiker), does not inform us to any considerable degree what the nature of this enterprise is. Almost any student of the history of modern philosophy is of course well aware of Kant’s transcendental philosophy which was not only meant to investigate the conditions of synthetic a priori judgments, but also culminated in an attempt to show that theoretical (“speculative”) metaphysics is impossible. The question thus arises: How could a course in metaphysics begin with transcendental philosophy? The answer is that transcendental philosophy for Brentano is reversed Kantianism, as Brentano thereby intends to establish the possibility of metaphysics as a theoretical science.

Another issue concerning M 96 concerns material that it contains from the Vienna period. This material concerns phenomenology as the second part of metaphysics. Whereas Brentano had previously designated ontology as the second part, he explicitly tells Carl Stumpf (in a letter dated 5 May 1877) that he is now interposing phenomenology between transcendental philosophy and ontology (Kaiser-el-Safti 2014, 184). Phenomenology, as he understands it, is a description of both psychical and physical phenomena, which is actually the same as descriptive psychology or psychognosy in Brentano’s later terminology. Descriptive psychology is still very much concerned with both classes of phenomena, and this is exhibited by Brentano’s attempt in his lectures (Ps 76) to demonstrate that there are three senses from the discernment of three kinds of sensory quality, i.e., physical phenomena (visual, auditory, and all the others in a single class). Of course, it would be unreasonable to reprimand Tănăsescu for not utilizing parts of Brentano’s extensive literary remains. Indeed, he is to be commended for using them to any extent at all, for many an interpreter relies solely on material that Brentano had published in his lifetime and on poorly constructed editions of his manuscripts. Nonetheless, it is arguable that Brentano's insertion of phenomenology into metaphysics (between transcendental philosophy and ontology) was important for the division between descriptive and genetic psychology, for the kind of psychology at that stage of metaphysics could only be concerned with phenomena while the transcendent (what lies beyond the phenomena) could only come into consideration in ontology, theology, and cosmology.

The final section of Part II (408–425) is concerned with Husserl’s reception of Brentano’s empirical psychology. While Tănăsescu does not venture into considerations of developments in Husserl’s thinking under the label “transcendental,” markedly different from what we have just discussed in Brentano’s metaphysical orientation, there are nonetheless very important differences in Husserl’s approach to consciousness in the first edition of the Logical Investigations (1900/01) as compared to the psychological orientation that Brentano was teaching. Most importantly, Husserl views consciousness in terms of an “apperception” (Auffassung), “apperception” (Apperzeption), or “interpretation” (Deutung) of the contents of sensation, which becomes all the more prominent in the final part of Tănăsescu’s book.

As regards that part, Tănăsescu is to be praised for his use of Ps 78 in his attempt to elaborate on Brentano’s theory of imagination as improper presentation (uneigentliche Vorstellung) with an intuitive core. Unfortunately, however, this part of the book ends on a rather disappointing note, as the exposition of Husserl’s theory on the same topic, as put forward in his 1904/05 lectures, is not fully satisfactory. While Tănăsescu is entirely right in seeing an important differentiating feature of Husserl’s theory in the concept of a “mode of apprehension” (Auffassungsweise), there is no mention of yet another important concept in Husserl’s theory, namely that of the picture-object (Bildobjekt) (Husserliana, vol. XIII, 19–24). According to Husserl, the apprehending of contents, whether these be sensations or phantasms, yields a consciousness of such an object. If, for example, we see a photograph we do not merely encounter a physical thing, but also that which actually represents the picture-subject (Bildsujet). According to Husserl, we encounter the image or picture-object. The glossy rectangular thing does not as such represent anything. Moreover, the picture-object for Husserl is a nothing (ein Nichts) (ibid., 22, 88), which is again a notion that Tănăsescu fails to discuss. The notion of the picture-object as a nothing was indeed already thematized in Husserl’s manuscript of 1898 on imagination (ibid., 22, 109f.), although Tănăsescu does not take this text into account.

All in all, Parts II and III of the book under review are to be recommended, provided that one disregards the treatment of Husserl’s imagination and reads the accounts of Brentano’s early philosophical orientation very cautiously, keeping in mind at all times that the primary sources could have been used more fully. If we consider what other scholars have recently done regarding Brentano, we may credit Tănăsescu for having done a much better job than a fair number  of them.


Brentano, Franz. Von der mannigfachen Bedeutung des Seienden nach Aristoteles. Freiburg im Breisgau: Herder, 1862.

_____. Die Psychologie des Aristoteles. Mainz: Franz Kirchheim, 1867.

_____. Metaphysik. Unpublished lecture manuscript, mainly from c. 1868, cataloged under signature M 96 in Houghton Library, Harvard.

_____. Psychologie vom empirischen Standpunkte, vol. I. Leipzig: Duncker & Humblot, 1874.

_____. Fortsetzung der Psychologie vom empirischen Standpunkte. Unpublished manuscript from c. 1875, cataloged under signature Ps 53 in Houghton Library, Harvard.

_____. Ausgewählte Fragen aus Psychologie und Ästhetik. Unpublished lecture manuscript, from 1884/85, cataloged under signature Ps 78 in Houghton Library, Harvard.

_____. Deskriptive Psycholoogie. Unpublished lecture manuscript, from 1887/88, cataloged under signature Ps 76 in Houghton Library, Harvard. Forthcoming edition, by Frechette, Guillaume and Taieb, Hamid, and forthcoming translation by Rollinger, Robin D.

Husserl, Edmund, (ed.) Marbach, Eduard. Husserliana, vol. XXIII: Phantasie, Bildbewusstsein, Erinnerung. Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1980.

Kaiser-el-Safti, Margret (ed.). Franz Brentano-Carl Stumpf: Briefwechsel 1867–1917. Frankfurt am Main: Peter Lang, 2014.

Rollinger, Robin D. “Brentano’s Psychology from an Empirical Standpoint: Its Background and Conception,” in Franz Brentano’s Metaphysics and Psychology. Upon the Sesquicentennial of Franz Brentano’s Dissertation, edited by Tănăsescu, Ion. Bucharest, Zeta, 2012, pp. 261–310.

[1] This work will henceforth be referred to simply as Psychology.

[2] I translate quotations from the reviewed book. I shall also translate some passages from Brentano’s manuscripts and also provide the original German texts in their cases.