Psychology and the Natural Law of Reparation

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C. Fred Alford, Psychology and the Natural Law of Reparation, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 182pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521863325.

Reviewed by Eugene Victor Wolfenstein, University of California, Los Angeles


At least in Anglophonic nations, we still hear echoes of Locke's articulation of natural law, and more specifically of the harm principle:

The State of Nature has a Law of Nature to govern it, which obliges every one: And Reason, which is that Law, teaches all mankind, who will but consult it, that being all equal and independent, no one ought to harm another in his Life, Health, Liberty, or Possessions. (In Laslett, ed., p. 271)

Although they are not with students of the natural law tradition, the interviews with young people that C. Fred Alford reports in his provocative new book reflect a belief in this moral imperative. Alford terms some of these informants "metaphysical biologists," because they affirm a conception of human equality based on the fact that (as one of them put it) "we all enter the world the same way, and we leave it in the same way, too" (Alford, p. 32). Others more explicitly affirm the notion and necessity of a social contract, and a few uphold a morality of care or concern. Listening to them, Alford maintains, should give us pause when we are inclined to attribute a rampant relativism to contemporary youth. Natural law, albeit truncated, is not altogether a dead letter. But Alford is listening to another voice of nature as well, whose most infamous spokesman is the Marquis de Sade:

Let us deign for a moment to illumine our spirit by philosophy's sacred flame; what other than Nature's voice suggests to us personal hatreds, revenges, wars, in a word, all those causes of perpetual murder? Now, if she incites us to murderous acts, she has need of them; that once grasped, how may we suppose ourselves guilty in her regard when we do nothing more than obey her intentions? (In Seaver & Wainhouse, eds, p. 332)

Alford does not reference de Sade, but there is, in his opinion, more than a little sadism in each of us. He follows Melanie Klein in claiming that the Todestrieb, the death-drive, is characterized by "sadism, envy, and destruction" (Alford, p. 68). And he assigns a certain priority to these deadly impulses: "we are first of all creatures who have wanted to destroy all that is good and life-giving"; "we have hated before we have loved" (p. 5). But, contra de Sade and again following Klein, Alford sees in our nature a redemptive propensity to feel guilt and so to repair the damage that our destructiveness entails. Hence the possibility of developing a natural law of reparation.

Along with concepts drawn from Klein, Alford makes use of the work of Wilfred R. Bion and D. W. Winnicott in constructing the psychoanalytic dimension of his analysis. The natural law side of the dialogue has more varied participants, from classical (St. Augustine, St. Thomas Aquinas) to contemporary theorists (e.g., H. L. A. Hart, Alasdair MacIntyre, Henry Veatch, and especially Jacques Maritain). The major aim of the enterprise is to deepen natural law theory psychoanalytically, but there also is a reflexive interest in strengthening the ethical dimension of psychoanalytic theory. The joining point between the two sides is the problem of evil, the "willful destruction of the good because it is good, and not me or mine" (p. viii). Envy comes close to being the root of all evil; sadism in particular and destructiveness in general are its most visible manifestations. Evil thus defined is part of human nature and so cannot be extirpated. This follows from Alford's psychoanalytic principles as surely as from theological ones. Because reparative tendencies linked to gratitude and love are also a part of our nature, however, the question arises: what are the conditions, both individual and social, for healing the wounds we inevitably inflict on ourselves and others, including the others whom we most love?

Psychology and the Natural Law of Reparation consists of four chapters, united thematically but diverging in focus and emphasis. The second, in which Alford reports his in-depth interviews, gives us reason to believe natural law theory has at least some current cultural viability. The first probes the matter more deeply, by taking up the long-standing issue of the role played by natural law in Sophocles' Antigone. Alford points out that, after Antigone proclaims the higher authority of "the gods' unwritten and unfailing laws," she goes on to say:

I knew I must die; how could I not?

even without your [Creon's] warning. If I die

before my time, I say it is a gain.

Who lives in sorrows such as are mine

how shall he not be glad to gain his death? (In Grene and Lattimore, eds., p. 174)

If Antigone is upholding natural law, Alford contends, she "seems over-eager to die for it" (Alford, p. 16). Put differently, she is motivated not by the law of familial relations and the life-affirming love that mediates it, but rather by "dark Eros, the desire to care for the ones we love confused with the desire to fuse with them in death…" (ibid.). Antigone's choice of action reveals, indeed, "how close love comes to hate, Eros to Death, good to evil, natural law to natural evil" (p. 18). She simultaneously upholds the law and enacts the forces that violate it.

Our understanding of natural law is advanced when the forces of death are given their more specific characterization as the evil in our nature. In his third chapter, Alford's conception of evil is filled out through engagement with St. Augustine and Hannah Arendt. In common with Augustine, he presupposes something akin to original sin, although of course he characterizes it differently: "Original sin is the child's hatred of the mother, the source of all goodness" (p. 120). More specifically, "Klein makes it clear that the infant and young child hates, envies, and would destroy its mother if it could, regardless of how responsive and loving mother truly is" (p. 68). The mother, like God in the Biblical tale, is the source of all that is good. The infant needs what it cannot control and, creature of privation that it is, envies that Being of endless abundance. Unable to master its fickle (not perfectly reliable in meeting its needs) mistress, it would destroy her. Interpreted this way, "Klein's categories are essentially religious" -- not only original sin as here conceptualized, but also versions of  "trespass, guilt, and salvation through reparation" (p. 120).

Along with Arendt, Alford argues that the absence of thought has something to do with the enactment of evil. But against her notion of the banality of evil, famously forwarded in Eichmann in Jerusalem, Alford argues that the appearance of thoughtlessness is the result of a fear of emotional disruption when thoughts are meaningfully joined. When the fear is sufficiently intense, attacks on linking, as Bion terms them, reduce thinking to defensive operations:

The result of attacks on linking is thinking marked by a lack of curiosity, a hatred of emotions, and from there it is but a short step to hatred of life itself. Emotions are what give life the feeling of living, not just existing. But when emotions are too intense and frightening, such as rage at and terror of abandonment. emotions are experienced as an alien intrusion into the self. An emotion or feeling itself becomes a hostile attacker that -- if it cannot be destroyed -- must be severed of all meaning. (P. 87)

The possibility of thinking as linking requires a family or a community that can contain or hold (as Winnicott would put it) destructive impulses, binding them with both understanding and love. Given the primary tendency in human beings to damage those nearest and dearest to them, "love almost always takes the form of reparation, not preparation, so to speak" (p. 98). But "only thinking can make reparation moral by directing reparation's passion toward those most truly in need…" (ibid.). For as Klein conceives it, reparation can be narcissistic, a self-enclosed attempt to restore to health the internal representations of the others we have injured (pp. 99 -- 104). Thinking that links us to others themselves is required if reparation is to function integrally to natural law.

As here conceived, natural law includes acknowledgment of evil; guilt; reparation; thinking as linking; and the holding or containing activities of human communities. In his last chapter, Alford adds pity, in the sense of the ability and willingness to feel the suffering of others, along with the kind of love that aims at the felicity of the one who is loved. Reparative natural law is then "a narrative that holds us, a tissue to wrap around us as though it were a second nature, a second skin," and one that must be grounded in the "less symbolic, more real holding of the social safety net, communities, and families" (p. 113). These, then, are the conditions in which it is possible at least partially to heal our self-inflicted wounds.


Alford is a truly inventive thinker who has consistently devoted himself to the understanding of important and troubling aspects of human experience. Psychology and the Natural Law of Reparation is rich in insight about just such matters, far richer than my thumbnail sketch of some of its principal arguments. Readers will have to judge for themselves how persuasive they find these arguments. For my part, I'm in the somewhat paradoxical position of agreeing with the greater part of Alford's conclusions while disagreeing most emphatically with his premises. This is not because I doubt that human beings are endowed with significant sadistic and destructive tendencies, among which envy is perhaps the most insidious and malicious. But it is not, nor could it be, the fact that hate comes before love or that "we are first of all creatures who have wanted to destroy all that is good and life-giving." For one thing, this line of analysis attributes far more in the way of defined emotions and stabilized mentation to infants than (as best we can tell) is characteristic of them.[1] Early life is a far more fluid field of sensuous interaction, characterized most of all by experiences of pleasure and pain. Pleasurable activities (being nursed, held, etc.) are also life-sustaining. In the instance of healthy development, they predominate; and from these experiences arises the forerunners of love and gratitude. Painful and frustrating moments are also necessarily present; and these give rise to the tendencies with which Klein and Alford are preoccupied. But if these tendencies were the prior and dominating conditions of human existence, human community would be quite impossible. There would be only a state of war, not a state of nature -- indeed, no chance for the evolutionary survival of such a species. Put somewhat differently, Alford comes close to placing himself in (as John Grey puts it) a "prominent tradition of Western thinking" in which "morality is a thin overlay covering human savagery" (Gray, p. 26). He doesn't quite enter this tradition, because he sees us as naturally inclined to repair the damage our savagery causes. But he is heir to some of the difficulties this view of our nature entails.

On the other hand, I do think that adult human beings, individually and collectively, are not far removed from the anxieties and persecutory phantasies of infancy that Klein so well captures in her conception of the paranoid-schizoid position. When these anxieties and phantasies combine with the nearly insatiable greed that is stimulated by capitalist economies, the powerful technologies that serve these greedy desires, and the enormously enhanced destructive capabilities of the modern war machines, then we have a situation in which a mind-numbing amount of damage is done to both inhabitants of this planet and the planet itself. Redemption and restoration seem quite impossible; repairing the damage to the extent possible is the task to which we must commit ourselves, if we are to salvage a humanly decent way of life from the ruins of our too great ambitions and too little wisdom. For this task, Alford offers us important tools. Or, as Max Weber told us, speaking in a similarly somber mood:

Even those who are neither leaders nor heroes must arm themselves with that steadfastness of heart which can brave even the crumbling of all hopes. This is necessary right now, or else men will not be able to attain even that which is possible today. Only he has the calling for politics who is sure that he shall not crumble when the world from his point of view is too stupid or too base for what he wants to offer. Only he who in the face of all this can say 'In spite of all!' has the calling for politics. (In Gerth and Mills, eds., p. 128) 



Gray, John (2007) "Are We Born Moral?" In The New York Review of Books, Volume LIV, Number 8.

Laslett, Peter, ed. (1988) John Locke: Two Treatises of Government. New York: Cambridge University Press.

Sade, Marquis de. Philosophy in the Bedroom. In Richard Seaver & Austryn Wainhouse, eds. The Marquis de Sade: Three Complete Novels…. New York: Grove Press, 1965.

Sophocles, Antigone. In David Grene and Richmond Lattimore, eds., Sophocles I. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1954.

Weber, Max (1919) "Politics as a Vocation." In Hans Gerth and C. Wright Mills, eds. From Max Weber: Essays in Sociology. New York: Oxford University Books, 1958.

Wolfenstein, Eugene Victor (1993) Psychoanalytic-Marxism: Groundwork. New York: Guilford Press.                       


[1] For an extended presentation of my own meditations on our human nature, see Wolfenstein, 1993, Chapter 6.