Public Art and the Fragility of Democracy: An Essay in Political Aesthetics

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Fred Evans, Public Art and the Fragility of Democracy: An Essay in Political Aesthetics, Columbia University Press, 2019, 342pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231187589.

Reviewed by Gary Shapiro, University of Richmond


It should be surprising that so little philosophical attention is devoted to questions concerning public art. The mutual relations of the political and the aesthetic are often thematized in the Continental tradition (think Heidegger, Sartre, Benjamin, Lyotard for starters). Public art, if one stops to think about it, would seem to be the most obvious site of these relations. Yet it has largely escaped the view of philosophers. Now Fred Evans has written an impressively argued and researched study concerning the politico-aesthetic prospects for public art, exploring this theme in terms of the fault lines and promises of what might be called "actually existing democracy." Specifically, this "essay in political aesthetics" is an experiment in clarifying the meaning of art that aims at expressing and enabling the life of the democratic polity. Evans's focus is almost exclusively on the situation in the United States. His book is especially timely, given recent and ongoing disputes about public art, such as the controversies and violent confrontations over removing Confederate statues (e.g., Charlottesville 2017) or new forms of memorializing the victims of racism (e.g., the Montgomery National Memorial for Peace and Justice, informally known as the Lynching Memorial). Evans contextualizes the question of public art in a democracy by considering, in depth and detail, the implications of the political and aesthetic thought of Rawls, Derrida, Badiou, Rancière, and Agamben. His study is extremely well informed about the history of US public art, from the first controversies concerning memorials to George Washington (ca. 1800) to the present; Evans draws intelligently on important studies by art historians like Kirk Savage who have shown that public art has been a matter of almost continuous dispute in the US since its founding.

Evans here extends and enriches his valuable earlier work on voice and citizenship, as in The Multi-Voiced Body: Society and Communication in an Age of Diversity (2008). There and in the current study (although now more implicitly) he builds creatively on Mikhail Bakhtin's critical concept of a plurality of voices and discourses, or heteroglossia. He argues that a democracy necessarily involves a multiplicity of distinct views, perspectives, and interests, a "multi-voiced body." These voices should be given rights of expression and contestation in the public sphere. For Evans, a democracy should enable and encourage a plurality of voices, and avoid submitting to what he calls "oracles," that is, unquestionable (dogmatic) voices of authority. On this view, a democratic polity will have the virtues of solidarity, heterogeneity, and fecundity. It will foster the sense that we're all in this together, that we respect others in their otherness, and aim at an ever more flourishing public life. Rather than engaging in reactionary nostalgia ("make America great again") we should aspire to become great. Evans is quite aware that no constitution, law, or (mythical) national character can secure a democracy in the virtues of solidarity, heterogeneity, and fecundity that he takes to define democracy. His contribution is to defend these virtues while critically identifying authoritarian obstacles (oracles) that impede them. In this respect, the book is much more than an essay on public art. Public art becomes a crucial locus for exploring the promise of pluralistic democracy in the light of a sober assessment of its inherent fragility.

Evans proposes a broad definition of public art: it "will encompass any artistic creation that has the intent or effect of addressing democratic values and occurs in public space" (10). This definition implicitly excludes art in those regimes (certain monarchies, theocracies and the like) that do not profess democratic values. Of course, virtually all polities today (excluding perhaps a few religious kingdoms and theocracies) claim to be democratic in some sense. Evans's definition is wide enough to embrace a spectrum of works, ranging from those that are government sponsored to dissident or guerilla art that aims at challenging official orthodoxies.

Evans first introduces some dilemmas concerning public art -- and the very meaning of public space -- by discussing several controversies concerning the Confederate statues, whose glorification of the "lost cause" and the Jim Crow era demonstrate the fragility of democracy. He finds an alternative to such degradation of the democratic experiment in Krzystof Wodiczko's work, which contested the gentrification and depoliticization of New York's Union Square. From its beginning in 1839 the space was aligned with the value of liberty, serving public gatherings, especially in times of crisis. The growing neo-liberalism of the 1980s saw the Square not only surrounded more intensely by commercial enterprise, but its internal structure altered by removing trees and consolidating paths to render it more panoptical, more subject to surveillance. Homeless people and political assemblies were to be brought under control. Wodiczko enacted a telling form of artistic resistance to this process, illuminating the existing statues of Washington, Lafayette, Lincoln, and Charity with transfiguring projections that associated them with the homeless, immigrants, and other marginalized groups. The oracle of neo-liberal "revitalization," actually a massive real estate deal, was briefly transfigured to suggest an open pluralization of voices.

Drawing on Claude Lefort, Evans focuses on the "empty space" in the public square that necessarily characterizes the topography of democracy. Stimulated also by Savage's indispensable history in Monument Wars, he refers throughout to the competing paradigms of the monumental structure (think Washington Monument) or the "plain tablet" (proposed by an early nineteenth century Congressional representative) on which citizens would be encouraged to write their own testimonies concerning the nation's founder. Evans sets up a context for assessing the sometimes competing, sometimes complementary visions of democracy and their implications for public art in two significant pairs: Rawls/Derrida and Badiou/ Rancière. These are meaty chapters that offer much provocative material for philosophers thinking about the intersections of art and politics. The discussions are enriched as Evans problematizes the concept of time as linear and continuous that is often thoughtlessly assumed in discourses about the monumental and other forms of public art. Here he finds important suggestions for conceptualizing alternative ideas of temporality, modernity, and contemporaneity in 20th century art like Robert Smithson's and art writers such as Terry Smith, Keith Moxey, and Peter Osborne. In marking a time and a place, public art also invokes a multiplicity of coexisting time schemes, or heterochronicity. This theme is usefully encapsulated in the principle that there is no natural hierarchy of times.

In the first gigantomachia that Evans stages, between Rawls and Derrida, issues of temporality and diversity come to the fore. Rawls's concept of the original position, in which participants tend to arrive at a consensus concerning principles of rights and distribution, is seen as having real, if limited value, with regard to its implications for public art. As Evans observes, a Rawlsian approach gives priority to consensus, so it would presumably exclude the allocation of public space and resources for blatantly divisive works such as the US Confederate "monuments." However, it's not so clear what Rawls would have to say about public art such as the Lynching Memorial or works that celebrate specific ethnic traditions. Rawls is good on solidarity, but we recall that this is only one criterion of a democratic polity. With respect to the others, heterogeneity and fecundity, Derrida's notion of a "democracy to come" fares much better. In that perspective, democracy is understood as an open-ended agonistic interchange, an unpredictable process open to including and listening to new voices, or in Evans's terms a "multi-voiced body." Going beyond consensus, which could lend itself to a stable state in which no group is offended by public art, Derrida would presumably be open to works like Judith Baca's Danzas Indigenas, a recent California monument to indigenous voices. A democracy to come would be premised on a radical hospitality that would open the polity and its public space to the overlooked and excluded.

A second major contrast of theorists who promise some insight regarding democracy and public art juxtaposes Badiou and Rancière. Both are concerned to develop a political thought that would make us more aware of the implicit and unexamined exclusions that characterize all political states, even those claiming the title of democracies. Badiou regards contemporary parliamentary and electoral "democracies" as instruments of conservative oligarchies. Authentic politics for him involves the production of truths, principles that emerge unpredictably from a prior situation and that mark a genuine event. The French Revolution was such an event; its declaration of a new set of universal rights constitutes a truth that calls for fidelity from those who have comprehended it. Badiou's fundamental ontology, drawn from set theory, involves a constant duality of that which has been recognized (counted) as significant and the void or excluded that has not (so far) attained recognition. Communism, rather than democracy as imperfectly practiced, would be the project of continually expanding the realm of the included. Badiou apparently has little to say about public art as such, but his "inaesthetics" sees art as another truth procedure, marked by unpredictable events which introduce transformative modes of creation. Art is not subordinate to politics, but parallel to it. Despite Badiou's valorization of inclusivity and the revolutionary quality of political and artistic events, Evans finds his philosophy inconsistent with the agonistic, heterogeneous interactions and discourses of democracy. This is because the theory supposes that there is a sharp duality between the "Immortals" who recognize and are faithful to the truths disclosed in genuine events and the "human animals" who fail at such recognition.

While also an advocate of inclusiveness, Rancière, in contrast to Badiou, places the aesthetic at the center of the political rather than seeing it as a parallel procedure. For Rancière a fundamental dimension of any society is the distribution (partage) of the sensible. The French partage allows the double meaning of both how access is apportioned to all forms of the sensible (aesthetic in the broad sense of aisthesis) and to what extent they are matters of shared, common experience. Inclusivity is understood here not as the emergence of the event and its truth, but as emancipation. For Rancière this involves an openness to "the part of those with no part," those marginalized or ignored in the existing polity. Every society can be understood in terms of the tension between its "police" -- all the means of maintaining existent hierarchies -- and "politics" -- consisting in attempts to revise or eliminate those hierarchies. The arts are relevant here in so far as they operate under the sway of the "aesthetic regime" which opens up aesthetic experience to everybody. In the spirit of Schiller's idea of aesthetic education, Rancière sees the arts in terms of shared human experiences leading to greater equality. From this perspective even an apparently apolitical writer like Flaubert implicitly promotes democratic practices and attitudes. In novels like Madame Bovary he describes ordinary people and events in a printed medium which could be read by anybody. The arts under the aesthetic regime are autonomous yet also political, not because of any represented content, but in so far as they expand the distribution of the sensible.

Evans offers a rigorous comparative analysis of the four thinkers with respect to their conceptions of democracy and their implications for public art. In this critique, Derrida and Badiou appear as philosophers with an affinity for the transcendental, with Rawls and Rancière on the side of immanence. The first pair make thought dependent on either a truth requiring absolute fidelity (Badiou) or an overarching commitment to the future and futurity (Derrida). The immanence-tending Rawls may simply be offering a circular reaffirmation of classical liberal principles (too narrow) while Rancière seems to have no criterion for excluding those political positions (like white supremacy) that conflict with democratic values. Evans views Rawlsian thought as too minimalist and consensus-oriented to support a robust public art that would foster diversity, heterogeneity, and encourage future growth or fecundity; it is too exclusive. Rancière's approach, on the other hand, because of the lack just noted, is too inclusive. Coming from his more transcendental position, Derrida is so committed to inclusive hospitality that he cannot theorize a lively agonistic politics. For Badiou, art becomes the vehicle of an Idea and so fails to contribute to what Rancière calls the "formation of a community of sense."

After this critique, Evans has two chapters examining two recent, large-scale US public art projects, Chicago's Millennium Park and New York's National 9/11 Memorial. The first is a celebration of life, the second a memorial to the dead. These chapters are subtle, careful studies that acknowledge the complex interplay of democratic tendencies (solidarity, heterogeneity, fecundity) and the competing voices of oracles, notably the powers of capital, commercialism, and nationalist exceptionalism which contributed to the sites' design and remain influential. The study of Millennium Park shows that it is threatened by the oracles of corporate power and spectacle which could overwhelm its potential democratic plurality of competing voices. Nevertheless, the Park maintains a fragile commitment to the democratic virtues, especially evident in Anish Kapoor's Cloud Gate installation where observers see themselves alternately merging with and separating from others.

Evans finds the 9/11 Memorial more problematic. He observes a spatial and thematic disconnect between Michael Arad's Reflecting Absence, the pair of huge outdoor fountains, which are set in the former Towers' footprints, and the 9/11 Museum. Reflecting Absence runs the risk of being mere spectacle, and so failing to foster reflection on future possibilities. The Museum, as Evans convincingly points out, focuses almost exclusively on the victims of the 9/11 attacks, obscuring any thought about the attackers' motives or the Afghanistan and Iraq wars that the US launched in reprisal -- and the victims of those wars. The oracle of American exceptionalism speaks too loudly here. In these respects the Museum, while aiming at solidarity, fails both in fostering dialogue and at encouraging a future-oriented fecundity. In relation to the 9/11 Memorial and Museum, Evans introduces a fascinating discussion of a proposed, unbuilt alternative work, Wodiczko's City of Refuge. This would have been anchored in New York harbor, reachable only by water with a transition at one of several intermediate transfer points. This large, floating and anchored sphere was meant to contain several levels (including an auditorium) intended to foster conversation about the causes, meaning, and consequences of the attacks. The site was meant to evoke the spirit of the Biblical cities of refuge, in which those accused of serious crime could have their cases fairly adjudicated. Many of these would be partially guilty, partially innocent. Such a site would have had a more complex temporality than the existing memorial and museum, opening up visitors' thought and discourse to wider swaths of past, present, and future. Evans argues that this work would have been largely free of the oracles' influence and would have been more in keeping with democracy in the sense he develops in the book.

Toward the book's end Evans becomes increasingly explicit about the need for public art in a democracy to encourage thought, discourse, and debate about the community's future. He poses the question of how such art can be an act of citizenship rather than a passively experienced landmark. In thinking the concept of futurity, Evans finds resources in the ideas of Derrida's idea of the event and Agamben's notion of pure potentiality. A fundamental criterion of democratic citizenship is keeping the future of the polity open for discussion by a heterogeneous and unpredictable multiplicity. This allows him to explain why anti-democratic voices such as those advocating white supremacy may get a hearing but cannot be accepted as authoritative. As Evans formulates this desideratum, "the participants in dialogue about democracy itself must always anticipate that a new discourse on this topic might emerge from their exchanges and gain audibility relative to the present ways of articulating it" (236).

Given Evans's focus on the US, we might remember that pragmatists, pluralists, and process philosophers like Peirce, James, Dewey, and Whitehead were also thinkers of novelty and futurity, often focusing on the community's deliberations concerning its own future. A relatively unexplored dimension of US thought is the virtual dialogue concerning Civil War and Confederate monuments between the Harvard colleagues James and Royce. James gave the official address dedicating the Boston memorial to Robert Gould Shaw, leader of the North's first black regiment, explaining his "civic courage" as concern for the community's future. In his Philosophy of Loyalty Royce defended the Southern practice of honoring the heroes of the "lost cause," notably Robert E. Lee. Some of the issues have been articulated and canvassed by art historians (e.g., Savage) or legal scholars (e.g., Sanford Levinson), but so far philosophers have had little to say. Many other polities (e.g., Germany, Russia, the heirs of the former Yugoslavia) are dealing now with parallel issues. Those involved in the ensuing discussions, in the US or elsewhere, will find that Evans's book articulates relevant and important topics.