Public Goods, Private Goods

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Geuss, Raymond, Public Goods, Private Goods, Princeton University Press, 2001, 152 pp, $19.95 (hbk), ISBN 0-691-08903-5.

Reviewed by Richard Kraut , Northwestern University


Public Goods, Private Goods is a brief and scintillating exploration of the multi-faceted distinction between public and private and the significance of that distinction for liberal political thought. It is an expansion of a talk Geuss gave at a conference in 1999, and retains the rhythm and tone of a wide-ranging and fascinating public address. Lively and provocative, it contains within its 114 pages of text an impressive assortment of ideas, arguments, and themes.

One of the basic ideas underlying the book is quite simple: “there is no single clear distinction between public and private but rather a series of overlapping contrasts, and thus … the distinction between the public and the private should not be taken to have the significance often attributed to it” (p. 6). Geuss’s way of supporting this claim is to sketch three actions performed by historical figures of the ancient Mediterranean world: Diogenes of Sinope (the Cynic philosopher) masturbating in the market place, Caesar crossing the Rubicon, and Augustine withdrawing from his profession as a teacher of rhetoric in order to meditate, with a few friends, in Cassiciacum.

The significance of each act depends on an opposition between the public and private realms, but, Geuss insists, it is a different kind of opposition in each case. In order to demonstrate the shamelessness needed to live a self-sufficient life unburdened by arbitrary social conventions, Diogenes did in public what the Athenians (and we) think should be done only in private. The public realm is a place where one can be expected to be observed by anyone who happens to be present; the private sphere, by contrast, is the space where one does not risk giving offense to others, because the gaze of others is not upon one.

Geuss’s second case study follows the career of Julius Caesar at the time when the Roman Senate demanded that he give up his military command and return to Rome to stand trial as a private citizen. He is reported by Appian to have said, as he hesitated on the border between Gaul and Italy, “If I don’t cross this river, I’m in trouble; if I do, everyone in the world is in trouble” (p. 45). Crossing the Rubicon was in effect a decision to “put his private interest before the common or public good” (p. 46). Here, Geuss notes, we have a different contrast from the one illustrated by the shamelessness of Diogenes. “’Public’ in the case of Caesar does not so much mean that to which anyone has free access, as (a) the realm of things that concern or affect everyone, and then derivatively (b) the set of agencies that have power over (and responsibility for) certain domains that are considered to concern everyone, that is that concern ‘the common good’” (p. 53, author’s emphasis). As Geuss points out (p. 53), one is making a substantive claim, not uttering a mere tautology, when one says that what is public in that it affects everyone should be public in that everyone should have free access to it. “Only after a series of prolonged and often violent confrontations was the principle established that the laws that applied to all (and were in that sense ‘public’) ought also be made known to all (displayed ‘in public’)” (p. 53).

The third case study brings out yet another use of the public/private distinction: Augustine’s spiritual meditations express the infinite value he places on mental acts that are almost completely inaccessible to all human beings other than the person who performs them – acts that are in this sense “private” (though Augustine himself does not refer to them as privatus). One’s mental states, as Augustine conceives them, are inherently private, epistemologically and ontologically. No such thing can be said about the private space in which one may choose to masturbate or defecate. Similarly, Caesar’s private good (his status or dignitas) cannot exist without being publicly recognized, and has nothing to do with Augustinean interiority.

Geuss’s discussion of these three cases is full of fascinating detail and astute observation. Even though they are offered as evidence of the multiplicity of the public/private contrast, their philosophical and historical interest goes far beyond their value as illustrations of his general thesis. But we come to the core of Public Goods, Private Goods in the chapter (entitled “Liberalism”) that comes next. Here Geuss holds that when liberals insist that there is a private sphere that must be protected from governmental (and perhaps social) encroachment, they are making a private/public distinction that differs from any of the three that occupied him in the earlier chapters. Unfortunately, a misstep occurs in his initial defense of this thesis. Consider the liberal idea that “my bank balance is my ‘private’ concern, no one else’s business, and that its confidentiality is to be protected” (p.76). Suppose liberal principles were violated and my bank balance were made public: would “public” not mean what it means when we say that Diogenes masturbated in public? Geuss thinks not. And yet in both cases, something claimed to be properly within the ken of a restricted few is being made accessible or visible to anyone who happens to come along. Here is what Geuss says to show that “public” means something different in each case: “That my financial situation is my own private concern does not mean that I ought to keep it to myself because anyone would be disgusted to be confronted with it …” (p. 74). True enough. But the disgust caused by public masturbation is what makes people object to its publicity; it is not what constitutes its publicity.

There is, however, a far more important point that can be made here: Even if the public/private distinction can be and has been drawn in many different ways and put to many different uses, and even if the distinction that liberalism seeks to draw is different from the three that Geuss sketches, that by itself need create no difficulties for liberals. They can happily agree that the distinction they want to draw is not quite like, or perhaps not anything like, the ones that are relevant in Geuss’s discussion of Diogenes, Caesar, and Augustine. And yet Geuss sometimes suggests that the multiplicity of the public/private distinction by itself casts doubt on the liberal project. Consider once again the passage cited above: “there is no single clear distinction between public and private but rather a series of overlapping contrasts, and thus … the distinction between the public and the private should not be taken to have the significance often attributed to it” (p. 6). Why “thus”? That there are several kinds of privacy does not impugn the liberal doctrine that one or more of them are of great political significance and deserve protection.

In his concluding chapter, Geuss grants that the multiplicity of the private/public distinction does not by itself show that the protection of a private sphere (in one sense of “private”) is not a desirable feature of political life. Even if there is no one thing captured by the phrase “right to privacy,” “[t]hat does not mean that none of the various things that have come to be grouped under ‘privacy’ are goods – far from it, many of them are extremely important and valuable – only that they are disparate goods, and the perfectly adequate grounds we have for trying to promote them have little to do with one another” (p. 105). And Geuss himself spends several pages (pp. 88-91) discussing several of the reasons why we might want to protect a sphere “within which physical or cognitive access to me should not be allowed to others not of my choosing” (p. 88): in the absence of such privacy, certain competitive practices might flounder, certain activities that require freedom from distraction might become impossible, and our liberty to carry out experiments might be diminished. Geuss is not uncritical of these three ways of justifying the protection of a private realm, but, in the end, as we have just seen, he agrees that many of the goods safeguarded by the protection of privacy are “extremely important and valuable.”

That concession does not sit well with the harsher appraisal of the public/private distinction put forward in the introductory chapter: “… [T]here are … ways of seeing the world that seem irresistibly plausible … to members of certain groups, although outsiders can see in them only tissues of delusion or theoretically ad hoc constructions. The public/private distinction is such an ideological concretion. … Unraveling the connections between different senses of ‘private’ and ‘public’ can help break the hold the public/private distinction has on our minds and allow us to see that political and moral options are available to us that might have been more difficult to see, or to evaluate positively, before” (pp. 10-11, author’s emphasis). By the time Public Goods, Private Goods draws to a close, we see that Geuss is trying to get us to use the public/private distinction in a more intelligent and reflective way – something that is not well described as “break[ing] the hold” the distinction has on us.

What Geuss favors, in fact, is an approach to the public/private distinction that was proposed by Dewey in The Public and its Problems: “The line between private and public is to be drawn on the basis of the extent and scope of the consequences of acts which are so important as to need control …” (pp. 84-85). Geuss’s gloss on this lies at the heart of his book: “It is not that we discover what the distinction is between the public and private and then proceed to determine what value attitudes we should have to it, but rather that given our values and knowledge we decide what sorts of things we think need regulating or caring for – and then stamp them ‘public’” (p. 86). This commits Geuss to saying that if, “given our values and knowledge,” we decide that it is important for all children to be taught the virtue of religious piety, then that should be made a matter of public regulation and encouragement. (Geuss accepts this commitment when he remarks: “We can and should ask whether the private ideal of spirituality is something for which we want to make a public place in our society,” p. 109). Geuss thinks that one is the victim of an illusion if one thinks that one is giving a good reason against making a public place for spirituality when one says that religion is not a public matter. “It is … a mistake to answer the question ‘Why shouldn’t we interfere with that?’ with ‘Because it is private,’ and think that this is the obvious end of the discussion. In itself it merely and tautologically says that we should not interfere because that is the kind of thing we think we ought not to interfere with” (p. 107, author’s emphasis).

Consider a case in which it is commonly agreed that a person’s privacy has been invaded: a stranger takes the seat next to mine on a bus and starts asking me about my sex life or my salary. Surely these things are none of his business. Not only am I within my rights to keep silent – he has already invaded my privacy by seeking this information. His impertinent questions have violated a reasonable social norm. Although in ordinary life I can tell him “that’s none of your business” and leave it at that, Geuss’s idea is that as political philosophers we must seek a justification for this common way of drawing a public/private distinction. But why so? Are some things not simply wrong? Why suppose that in telling the stranger that he should mind his own business, we have not yet hit rock bottom, and that more justification is needed?

Geuss does not explicitly answer this question, but I suspect that he is guided by the controversial assumption that all norms and rules must be justified in terms of the goods that they promote. “That’s none of your business” cannot be the end of the matter because any line drawn between what is my business alone and what is also the business of others must be justified in terms of the goods that will be promoted by drawing that kind of line in one place rather than another. It is because Geuss is making this assumption that he says, in a passage already cited, that some of the things put into the category of the private are extremely important goods (p. 105). When he wants to preserve a public/private distinction, that is because he holds that some great good will come of drawing that line in some place or other. His plea is that we become more sensitive to the many different kinds of goods that are in play, when we make a public/private distinction; that we become open to the possibility that the line will need to be drawn in different places, depending on the good in question; and that we become unwilling to draw the distinction whenever doing so accomplishes nothing worthwhile.

But liberals can respond to Geuss by asking why we should assume that the production of some good is the only reason that can be given in favor of maintaining a private zone. To give the problem a more abstract formulation: why suppose that doing good is the only reason for action? Why not suppose instead that reasons for action are of many different kinds, and that protecting a sphere of privacy is important not because it leads to some further good, but because it partly constitutes the right relationship between certain human beings? After all, the outrage we feel towards a nosy stranger is based on our conviction that he has violated a space to which we are entitled. Why do we have to back that up with an argument about how much good is done by that separation of the public from the private? Geuss might reply that this deontological approach to political theory relies on nothing but “folk reactions” and an illusory sense of self-evidence (p. 10). But philosophy cannot entirely dispense with pre-theoretical intuitions. The idea that the only way to justify making a distinction between the public and the private, and of drawing the line in one place rather than another, is by appealing to what is good, rather than what is right, is not one that can simply be taken for granted.

I have focused on the central theme of Public Goods, Private Goods, but in doing so I risk giving the wrong impression of its contents. The book is full of wonderful tangential points – some historical, some conceptual – from which I have learned a great deal. Much that he says resists summarization. Geuss meanders; he does not regiment his text so that every point made is in the service of the larger themes of the book. This would be a recipe for disaster in the hands of a less insightful and learned author, but we are lucky that Geuss has not bound himself to this tight structural requirement. He has read deeply and widely; he has a fertile and subtle mind; and he writes with wit and verve. Too few philosophical works are a great pleasure to read. This is one of them.