Public Reason and Political Community

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Andrew Lister, Public Reason and Political Community, Bloomsbury, 2013, 235pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781780936574.

Reviewed by Kevin Vallier, Bowling Green State University


Political liberalism is distinguished from other forms of liberal political theory by its acceptability requirement. The requirement holds that some feature of political decisions -- typically coercive laws and policies -- must be acceptable to all reasonable, or suitably qualified, points of view. Political decisions, then, are only morally permissible when the acceptability requirement is met. Political liberals say that a law or decision is publicly justified when it satisfies the requirement.

I have sometimes heard it said that political liberalism is a derelict research program, that it focuses primarily on Rawls exegesis and employs vague and unhelpful ideas as its key concepts. This is untrue. And one bit of evidence is Andrew Lister's new book, which exhibits the ongoing and innovative development of the political liberal research program. It addresses a number of tightly related challenges to political liberalism and offers original solutions to them.

Lister's book answers a significant challenge to political liberalism: the attempt to separate its commitment to an acceptability requirement from its common commitment to egalitarian social justice. Political liberalism has frequently been associated with egalitarian political polices, stretching all the way back to Political Liberalism, in which Rawls rejects the justice of the welfare state on the ground that it cannot protect the fair value of the political liberties. But, Gerald Gaus, one of today's leading political liberals, has argued that reasonable and suitably qualified individuals deeply disagree about the nature of social justice. For example, some classical liberal members of the public have strong reasons to object to the coercion required to sustain strongly egalitarian laws and policies. If Gaus is right, political liberalism's acceptability requirement is violated by strongly egalitarian states because non-egalitarians have sufficient reason to reject egalitarian policies.

If, in response, political liberals water down their acceptability requirement in order to justifiably force classical liberal members of the public to comply with the dictates of the egalitarian state, then perhaps unacceptably perfectionist policies -- ones that require the state to advance a sectarian conception of the good -- can be publicly justified as well.

So, the political liberal faces a dilemma: depending on how the acceptability requirement is specified, it either prohibits egalitarian policies and permits classical liberal policies, or it allows for too many perfectionist and paternalist policies. Lister's overarching aim is to provide an answer to the "classical liberal" horn of this complex and subtle "anti-perfectionist dilemma." Doing so is no small task, however, as the challenge pushes Lister to introduce several innovative modifications into the political liberal literature: (i) a new distinction between different models of public justification, (ii) an account of how to individuate coercive laws, policies and decisions to be justified, and (iii) an original "civic friendship" grounding of public reason.

The structure of the book develops these modifications in stages. In Chapter 1, Lister introduces a new framing of debates among political liberals between what he calls the "reasons-for-decisions" model and the "coercion" model of public justification. In Chapter 2, he refutes several unsuccessful justifications of public reason, such as arguments based on conscience and equal treatment, along with answering several standard objections to public reason. In Chapter 3, he criticizes the common "respect for persons" defense of public reason and argues that the coercion model goes down with the respect-based defense of public reason. In Chapter 4, he rebuts an attempt to save the coercion model by tweaking the individuation of coercion. In Chapter 5, he introduces a "civic friendship" grounding of public reason, which he believes vindicates his reasons-for-decisions framing of public justification. In Chapter 6, he concludes by showing how the reasons-for-decisions model and the coercion model differ in political practice. The reasons-for-decisions model permits the legalization of same-sex marriage; the coercion model may not, because it probably requires abolishing legal marriage altogether.

Briefly: Lister's answer to the classical liberal horn of the anti-perfectionist dilemma is that the reasons-for-decisions model does not default to no state coercion in the case of a failed public justification. Instead, reasons for political decisions are the object of public justification, and a failure to publicly justify a political decision defaults to an exclusion of divisive, unshared reasons. If the default is an exclusion of reasons, then the state may coerce so long as the balance of shared public reasons justifies the coercion. In this case, political liberals cannot prevent mutually acceptable egalitarian reasons from justifying egalitarian coercion. So, while it might turn out that egalitarian policies can't be justified on the reasons-for-decisions model, there is less standing in their way. Consequently, the reasons-for-decisions model makes it easier to avoid classical liberalism, and the first horn of the anti-perfectionist dilemma is answered.

Importantly, Lister admits that the second horn remains, as the reasons-for-decisions model may make the justification of paternalist coercion easier. It may even make the justification of abortion rights more difficult than on the coercion model (2).

Public Reason and Political Community has many strengths, especially its original attempt to provide a civic friendship foundation for political liberalism. However, I will spend the rest of the review outlining a problem in its main line of argument. My main concern is that the civic friendship ground of public reason does not vindicate the reasons-for-decisions model over the coercion model. If so, then Lister's attempt to defuse the classical liberal horn of the anti-perfectionist dilemma is unsuccessful.

I. The Reasons-for-Decisions Model vs. the Coercion Model

Lister's argument depends on distinguishing between two objects of public justification -- the justification of reasons for decisions and the justification for coercive laws and policies. He introduces the distinction like so:

Is it coercive state action that must be unanimously acceptable to the appropriately idealized public; otherwise, we default to not acting, that is, not having a law or policy? Or, is it our principles, that is, our reasons for political decisions that must meet the unanimity criterion; otherwise, we default to not including the reasons in the grounds of our deliberations? (1)

Lister also puts the distinction this way:

In the first account, it is the reasons that lie behind our decisions that must pass the qualified acceptability test, otherwise we exclude the reasons in question from our decision-making. In the second, it is that the laws themselves must pass the qualified acceptability test, otherwise we refuse to enact any law, in the domain in question. While many variations of the two basic ideas are possible, considering them in their pure form will help clarify many of the debates about public reason. (15)

So, the two models have two components: a specification of what must be justified and a specification of what to do when justification fails, the social state we default to when a claim is not publicly justified.

To assess the distinction more clearly, we need to add a bit of detail to Lister's framing of the distinction. Consider a generic three stage model of public justification:

1. Reasons1 to Accept  2. Reasons2 to Accept  3. Coercive Laws and Policies

The ultimate aim of a public justification is to justify a coercive law or policy. But, in order to justify a law or policy, we must settle on an account of which reasons may be used to accept or reject the policy. We settle on that by appealing to reasons-to-accept-reasons, which, in turn, select the reasons to accept laws and policies. Thus, reasons1 are reasons that determine which reasons2 are justificatory, and reasons2 can be publicly used to support or reject proposed coercion.

The reasons-for-decisions model and the coercion model both have three stages:

Reasons-for-Decisions Model: 1. Diverse Reasons to Accept  2. Inconclusive Shared Justificatory Reasons to Accept  3. Coercive Laws and Policies.

Coercion Model: 1. Diverse Reasons to Accept  2. Conclusive Diverse Justificatory Reasons to Accept  3. Coercive Laws and Policies.

On both models, citizens must have good reasons to affirm the justificatory reasons they use to support or oppose laws and policies. And on both models the appropriately circumscribed set of justificatory reasons is used to influence the justification and selection of coercive laws and policies. Lister's description of the coercion model does not bring out with sufficient clarity the fact that justificatory reasons must have certain minimal epistemic credentials: reasons2, too, must be grounded in reasons1.

But consider differences. First, the reasons-for-decisions model insists that the set of justificatory reasons be acceptable to all suitably qualified points of view. The coercion model does not. It merely insists that members of the public be able to see the justificatory reasons John offers in political discussion as justified for him, not for all members of the public. In this way, the reasons-for-decisions frame and the coercion-frame are associated with the consensus and convergence conceptions of justificatory reasons, a distinction common in the literature (17).

The reasons-for-decisions model also allows people to be coerced even when their assessment of the balance of shared reasons does not favor the law proposed. One can be justifiably coerced even if the justification for the law is inconclusive, meaning that a reasonable citizen can deny that the reasons in question vindicate a given law or policy. In fact, on Lister's view, even if Reba thinks that the balance of shared reasons implies that a law should be rejected as worse than no law at all, then the law may still be permissibly imposed on her. The coercion model only permits laws to be imposed when each person has a balance of diverse justificatory reasons to accept or at least not to oppose the law in question.[1]

These two differences explain why the two views have different defaults. Because people can be coerced based on an inconclusive public justification on the reasons-for-decisions model, there is no normative pressure to default in favor of no law when an individual believes the balance of public reasons defeats the law. In contrast, when a suitably idealized person's view of the total balance of reasons, shared and unshared, is taken to defeat the law, the coercion model defaults to no law.

Thus, the coercion model defaults at stage 3, whereas the reasons-for-decision model defaults at stage 2. The former defaults to no law, whereas the latter defaults to an exclusion of reasons from consideration.

To make this clearer, we can understand the two models as follows: the reasons-for-decisions model permits state coercion if it is based on an inconclusive balance of shared reasons, whereas the coercion model prohibits state coercion unless it is based on a conclusive balance of diverse reasons.[2]

II. The Ambiguous Implications of Civic Friendship

I believe that the value of civic friendship is not better realized by adopting a shared reasons requirement over a diverse reasons requirement, or by rejecting a conclusivity requirement. If my worries are well-founded, Lister has not vindicated the reasons-for-decisions model.

Lister claims, "the joint commitment to making political decisions on public grounds realizes a valuable kind of relationship" (106). The goal of acting as a collective agent can motivate excluding reasons from consideration. Importantly, the value of civic friendship is not primarily instrumental to realizing some other sort of value. No, the reasons-for-decisions model is constitutive of civic friendship. If we seek civic friendship with others, we must exclude diverse reasons from consideration (107). Again: "This exclusion of reasons is constitutive of a relationship of mutual respect in the face of deep, ongoing disagreement" (109). This is based on the observation that "Much of social life involves a concern for the reasons on which we base decisions concerning our joint activities" (111). For political decisions to be our decisions, we must choose together based on reasons we can all recognize. Choice based on shared reasons is juxtaposed with choosing based on "the product of divergent reasoning filtered through a formal aggregation process," which corresponds to the coercion model (113). We do not want to rest political decisions on "an accidental convergence of comprehensive doctrines" (115, emphasis mine). Lister is clear that using non-public reasons does not necessarily disregard or insult others, or undermine their capacities to reason well. Instead, "The argument is rather that the commitment to making political decisions on public grounds realizes a valuable relationship between citizens" (121).

I believe widespread compliance with the demands of the reasons-for-decisions model can help constitute relations of civic friendship. But, if Lister is to vindicate the reasons-for-decisions model, he must show that the model better realizes civic friendship than the coercion model (not to mention show there aren't countervailing considerations that favor the coercion model over the reasons-for-decisions model). I am convinced, however, that the coercion model better realizes civic friendship.

The reason that civic friendship favors a diverse reasons requirement over a shared reasons requirement is that we undermine civic friendship when we insist that people not appeal to the reasons that most inspire and drive them. Consider religious citizens who rely heavily on diverse reasons in thinking through political issues. If they are prepared not to coerce without a public justification, but can use religious reasons as defeaters for laws and in public discussion, then they will feel less alienated from politics and from secular citizens. Shared reasons requirements can marginalize citizens of faith and require that they violate their integrity. How can deeply religious citizens realize civic friendship when they are treated in this way, as the reasons-for-decisions model demands?[3]

Civic friendship is also better realized by conclusive public justifications because citizens cannot be permissibly coerced when, in their own judgment, the balance of shared reasons defeats the coercion in question. Lister permits the coercion of citizens even when they find a law unacceptable on common grounds. How can the coercers realize civic friendship with the coercees by forcing them to comply with a proposal that the coercees oppose based on their assessment of the balance of shared reasons? A critic could reply that embracing a conclusivity requirement on public justifications would lead us to classical liberal political conclusions such that citizens cannot realize civic friendship through the common or shared pursuit of social justice. But, given that social justice is a matter of deep dispute, pursuit of social justice under the reasons-for-decisions model may be sectarian and divisive, rather than unifying.

Lister makes clear that public reason liberals must face up to the anti-perfectionist dilemma, something many in the literature have not recognized. Further, he has invented several new approaches to public reason to help solve the dilemma -- strategies with which all interested parties should become familiar. Public Reason and Political Community is thus a significant contribution to an ongoing and fruitful research program. Most importantly, Lister helps us understand how to live on moral terms with citizens who disagree with us about important matters. That is a significant achievement.

[1] There is a caveat here, however. On the coercion model, one could be committed via public justification to using a justified decision procedure to select from a set of inconclusively justified laws.

[2] We could create two more models: a conclusive, shared reasons standard or an inconclusive, diverse reasons standard.

[3] Lister may be able to appeal to his marriage analogy and counterfactual assurance arguments to formulate a reply.