Punishment and the Moral Emotions: Essays in Law, Morality, and Religion

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Jeffrie G. Murphy, Punishment and the Moral Emotions: Essays in Law, Morality, and Religion, Oxford University Press, 2012, 322pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199764386.

Reviewed by C.L. Ten, National University of Singapore


In this volume of Jeffrie Murphy's elegant essays, he discusses the moral emotions which feature in our responses to criminals and other wrongdoers. He indicates that he has moved towards a softer version of retributivism and adopted a more generous view of when mercy and forgiveness to wrongdoers are appropriate. He had earlier endorsed the remark, "To err is human, to forgive supine". But now he does not regard repentance by the wrongdoer as a precondition of forgiveness by the victim.

Resentment at wrongdoing is not intrinsically evil. It stands as emotional testimony of self-respect and respect for the moral order. A person who lacks resentment shows a personality that is servile and lacking in respect for himself and his rights. It is only when resentment gets out of control and the victim of wrongdoing is obsessed by the desire for revenge that he threatens the legal and moral order. It is then that forgiveness plays an important role as a healing virtue, checking our tendencies towards cruelty. Forgiveness is helped by the sincere repentance of the wrongdoer. But to demand repentance of the wrongdoer risks fakery, with offenders making claims of repentance which are insincere and expedient.

Murphy describes with sympathy aspects of a Christian perspective which makes forgiveness less difficult. The perspective breaks down the sharp dichotomy between us, as fallible and flawed persons, and wrongdoers. It helps to check our justified resentments and demands for punishment, and to prevent them from becoming malicious hatreds and rationalizations for sadistic cruelty. A Christian perspective also helps forgiveness by seeing the wrongdoer as the innocent child he once was. Christianity sees the universe as ultimately benign, and if we adopt this view, then we would not be so inclined to see ourselves as isolated in our struggle against evil.

Murphy says that he has retreated from his earlier defense of "retributive hatred" in favor of the view that retribution must be compatible with a properly understood doctrine of Christian love. We have to be wary not to be driven to punishment by the dark emotions of malice, spite, envy, and cruelty. He explores the practice of criminal punishment from the perspective of agape or Christian love, paying particular attention to Jesus's injunction to love your neighbor as yourself. All human beings are to be regarded as neighbors. But Christian love is not just being "nice and cuddly". It involves promoting a person's moral and spiritual good. It therefore has a paternalistic dimension of improving the person's character. Murphy points out that this would involve the rejection of what others regard as a fundamental right of personal autonomy. However, there are various constraints on what the state may do in order to promote the virtuous character of criminals. These include the inefficiency of officials and the dangers of using state power to encourage a particular version of the good life in the context of religious pluralism. Murphy seems to settle for relatively uncontroversial improvements to prison life that would be acceptable to both religious believers and secular liberals alike. Although love can be stern and demanding in expressing proper resentment and indignation toward wrongdoing, Murphy maintains that mere brute hatred and disgust, no matter how widely shared, do not provide good reasons for the criminalization and punishment of homosexual sodomy.

Murphy discusses in illuminating detail whether there is an "honorable emotional basis for retribution", taking up Nietzsche's warning that one should "mistrust all in whom the impulse to punish is powerful". For Nietzsche that impulse is driven, not by the requirements of justice and desert, but by base, hateful, and irrational passions. Murphy also rejects Michael Moore's claim that proper retributive judgments are based on guilt rather than the dark emotions exposed by Nietzsche. Murphy believes that our attributions of guilt are often misplaced and irrational, and might mislead us to demand severe punishment for conduct that is objectively trivial, or even unobjectionable. He rejects Moore's version of retributivism, which he calls "character retributivism", the view that wrongdoers are to be punished in proportion to their inner wickedness. He believes that once we think that we are competent to make negative judgments about a person's deep character, then we are psychologically inclined to treat him contemptuously and cruelly. He expresses skepticism about our capacity to make reliable judgments about the deep character of criminals. He also raises the objection that some who make confident judgments about the deep character of wrongdoers have the potential for evil within themselves, and have been lucky because of favorable social circumstances to avoid legal and moral wrongdoing.

Other essays in the collection discuss the emotion of jealousy, which often generates serious crimes, the idea of human dignity and how it might be defended, and the more specific views of Kant on the defense of necessity when invoked in three types of cases: killing to save one's life in a shipwreck, a woman killing at birth her illegitimate baby, and a soldier killing another soldier in a duel. The discussion of Kant's view is loosely related to the general theme of the role of the emotions by the claim that the emotion of shame might serve as an excusing condition in mitigating the punishment for homicide.

Throughout Murphy comes across as a deeply humane and generous person, trying hard to maintain a proper balance between the positive and the negative reactions to wrongdoing. He is sensitive to the claims made by those with whom he disagrees, and he is humble in acknowledging his mistakes and the limitations of his views. He can sometimes be blunt, but still polite, as when he describes the view that forgiveness is incompatible with law and punishment as "deeply wrong -- confused all the way down, if I may say so" (p. 46). There is also a touch of robust commonsense when he counters the overdramatic view of linking love too closely with the fear of death. It is, he notes, a model of love appropriate for some stages, but not all. Life does not, and should not, always imitate art. In art, lovers tend to die young, "before reality raises its ugly head -- because who wants to imagine Tristan with a prostate infection, Isolde with menstrual cramps, or Orpheus and Eurydice arguing over who will drive the kids to the doctor this time?" (p. 239) And yet love in real life is "a valuable kind of real love". Murphy so neatly and effectively brings down the emotional temperature in order to show an important truth.

Above all, Murphy tries to be fair to all. This is tested to the limit in his account of whether we should forgive those who commit terrible evil and remain unrepentant. He relates the issue to the idea of human dignity and dwells on the example of the general in Dostoevsky's The Brothers Karamazov. An eight year old boy playfully threw a stone and hurt the paw of the general's favorite hound. The general locked up the boy for the night. Next morning at dawn, at the general's command, the boy was stripped naked, and made to run as he is hunted down by a pack of wolfhounds before his mother's eyes. He is torn to pieces by the dogs. Murphy thinks that it would be morally legitimate never to forgive the general and to respond to him with contempt and loathing. But the general's human dignity and human rights should still be respected. We are not entitled to treat him in any way we desire. He also suggests that the general is to be pitied.

Murphy provides several reasons for not excluding even terrible wrongdoers like the general from the class of beings with human dignity and rights. First, regarding some members of our species as nonhumans can have terrible social consequences not only for them, but also for the character of those who adopt this view. Secondly, we should adopt a certain moral humility towards our own wisdom and goodness, and acknowledge both the limitations of our powers to know the inner lives of others, and our own potential for evil. Finally, we should resist the temptation to distance ourselves too far from people like the general. Being virtuous and law-abiding does not mean that we have splendid characters all the way down. Rather, we might have been lucky in facing favorable social circumstances.

Although Murphy places important considerations before us, his case is not wholly persuasive. Having human dignity would be sufficient for not being tortured or cruelly treated, but it is not necessary. We condemn cruelty to animals without including them in the class of beings with human dignity. As Bentham had famously argued, it is their capacity to suffer which is crucial. Here Murphy's case for the proper treatment of persons like the general seems to be insufficiently Benthamite.

His attempt to narrow the gap between ordinary law-abiding people and the unrepentant general is also overdone. He makes the following observation:

Perhaps I cannot imagine myself joining Dostoevsky's general in sending my dogs to kill a small boy, but I can -- alas - imagine myself a different general who, in time of war, might order a cannon bombardment of a village while knowing that many small boys and other innocent people will be torn to bits. How big, then, is the moral gap between the two generals? (p. 271, n. 16)

Given more likely details, the gap is huge. Succumbing to normally unthinkable acts in order to prevent even greater cruelty from being inflicted is vastly different from torturing a child in front of his mother for a trivial offense. The reasons and motivations are different. Dostoevsky's general, but not Murphy's general, resorts to extreme cruelty at the drop of a pin, or perhaps a stone, and remains unrepentant.

An ordinary decent law-abiding person would regard it as morally legitimate to loathe Dostoevsky's general and treat him with contempt, though not to deprive him of his human rights. He will never forgive the unrepentant general. In what sense can he get closer to the general by imagining himself doing what the general did? If he discovered that in the appropriate circumstances he would act like the general, he would regard this part of his character or personality as an alien force to be eradicated if possible, and to be subject to the same loathing and contempt he had earlier directed to the general. He would lose all his sense of self-respect if he could not change. It is a condition of his strong reaction to the general that he believes that there is a great moral distance between himself and the general.

On the other hand, if he finds the distance missing, and that deep down his character is very much like that of the general, then he is no longer the decent law-abiding citizen we started out with. He would no longer react to the general with contempt and loathing. Murphy's plea for moral humility and for not distancing ourselves too far from wrongdoers is wise, compassionate, and even admirably instructive. It is an appropriate response to many kinds of wrongdoing. But when confronted with the extreme cruelty of someone like the unrepentant general, it is crucial that we keep sufficient moral distance from him. Without that, we will lose the basis of our powerful and crucially important negative reactive attitudes towards him.

Murphy's humility extends to his response to a critic who complains that Murphy is insufficiently explicit and systematic in defense of his view. Murphy regards himself as essentially an essayist who paints the big picture in rather broad strokes. He is indeed a superb essayist, and the essays in this collection are beautifully written. However, bringing together a number of essays written at different times and originally published in different places has its own hazards. One problem, as Murphy himself notes, is repetition. This does not matter when the essays are published separately in their original state. But it is a different matter when they are brought together. Some minor repetitions, such as the same quotations or examples being used several times, still do not matter. But extensive overlaps are another matter. This is true of substantial parts of Chapters 8 and 12, which would have benefited from some editorial changes. There is also the oddity of the original footnotes being retained unchanged, even when the reference is to another essay in the same volume. We are directed elsewhere when the relevant work is only a few pages away.

But these are minor blemishes in a collection that will be read with much pleasure and instruction.