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Thom Brooks, Punishment, Routledge, 2012, 282pp., $49.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415431828.

Reviewed by Michael Davis, Illinois Institute of Technology


Punishment pledges to be two books in one, an introductory text in punishment theory and a defense of a new theory of punishment ("the unified theory") (11). Its overall design is certainly appealing, whichever book one chooses to read. The first half of the book presents four "general theories" of punishment (retributivism, deterrence, rehabilitation, and restorative) and three kinds of "hybrid theories" (mixed theories, including those of Hart and Rawls, expressivism, and the author's own theory). The second half ("Case Studies") applies the theories to four subjects in criminal justice now topical (capital punishment, juvenile offenders, domestic abuse, and sexual crimes). Putting the theories to work is supposed to reveal their respective strengths and weaknesses -- as well as allow students to see the point of punishment theory (without overwhelming them with philosophical or legal detail). The final chapter concludes with words with which any punishment theorist can agree: "If you care about justice, then you should care about punishment" (216). The book also includes extensive notes, bibliography, and index.

I therefore began Thom Brooks' Punishment very much on its side -- but I ended with that disappointment one feels when, with bases loaded and the score tied, a mighty slugger only hits a single. The disappointment is, I think, primarily one of theory, a lack of clarity about the purpose, structure, and limits of punishment theories. But that lack of clarity is also a problem for use as a text. Students are, I think, unlikely to come away from the book with a clear sense of the actual differences among various theories.

Perhaps this pedagogical problem can be avoided, or at least substantially reduced, by combining Punishment with an anthology that lets some theorists speak for themselves. However that may be, the theoretical disappointment would remain. So, I shall use the balance of this review to sketch my reasons for theoretical disappointment. I believe the sketch will reveal merits of the book as well as its main faults.

Brooks' lack of clarity begins with his explanation of what constitutes a theory of punishment. Drawing on H. L. A. Hart, Brooks says, in effect, that any theory of punishment consists of a) a definition of punishment, b) a general justifying aim of punishment, and c) a distribution of punishment (6). Since Brooks will later discuss "mixed theories", he must allow for more than one general justifying aim (say,both deterrence and condemnation). His "a" should therefore have been "at least one". More troubling for Brooks, however, is that some theories of punishment may have no general justifying aim. This might happen in one of two ways. First, the theory might justify punishing some crimes for one reason and other crimes for another, with none of the justifications being general to all crimes. A theory might, for example, justify punishing some crimes because they do harm (making avoiding harm the relevant justifying aim), others because they are disgusting (making avoiding disgust the relevant justifying aim), and still others to maintain a useful convention (making the convention's maintenance the justifying aim). Second, some theories, especially retributive theories, have no justifying aim at all. The assumption that we are to justify a social arrangement by what it aims at is typical of consequentialist theories (that is, it assumes that justification is solely a matter of means-end reasoning). Some justifications are not like that. For example, we can justify keeping a promise simply by pointing out that we made the promise and that (all else equal) promises should be kept. We need not point to any aim keeping the promise will achieve (apart from the trivial one of keeping the promise itself). So, by the middle of the Introduction, Brooks has already made understanding non-consequentialist theories of punishment harder than necessary.

Since Brooks shares this mistake with both Hart and some recent punishment theorists, I don't think it a mistake that requires us to stop reading the book. Rather, it is the sort of mistake that should put us on our guard: here is a book that is likely to misunderstand certain theories.

Those misunderstandings begin almost as soon as we reach the next chapter, the first of those describing a standard theory, the chapter titled “Retributivism”. Some of the misunderstandings in this chapter seem to arise from mere carelessness. For example, Brooks tells us that "[perhaps] the most classic version of retributivism is found in the Code of Hammurabi's lex talionis, more commonly known as 'an eye for an eye and a tooth for a tooth'" (17). Brooks gives no source for this claim, seemingly taking it as the common wisdom. Yet, even a quick reading of the Code serves to disprove it. True, the Code (§196) does say, "If a [free] man put out the eye of another [free] man, his eye shall be put out" (with the same for "tooth", §200, and even "bone", §197). But the Code has many more provisions that do not seem to fit lex talionis at all, for example (§198): "If he [a free man] put out the eye of a freed man, or break the bone of a freed man, he shall pay one gold mina."[1] So, even if "classic retributivism" consisted of giving like for like, Hammurabi's Code would be far from a good example.

While such lapses of scholarship are more frequent than I would like, suggesting careless editing as well as careless writing, they are not the primary failing of Brooks' treatment of retributivism. The primary failing is not distinguishing between moral retributivism, such as Kant's, and legal retributivism, such as can be found in Herbert Morris's work or my own.[2] So, for example, Brooks asserts that the reason that retributivists

will want to punish the murderer more than the thief. . . . is because retributivists do not merely punish persons to the degree they are morally responsible for committing the crime, but rather to the degree they are morally responsible for committing a wicked action. (19-20)

This use of "wicked" struck me as doubly unfortunate. On the one hand, my students now seem to use "wicked" (when they do) to mean great, terrific, or the like (as in, "The new iPhone is really wicked"). Is usage different in Brooks' England? On the other hand, few contemporary retributivists use "wicked" in the old-fashioned sense Brooks intends (seriously morally wrong). Indeed, few, if any, use the word at all. So, we are left to wonder why Brooks chose "wicked" when he might have made his point using the more colloquial "seriously morally wrong". Did he want retributivism to sound old-fashioned? He certainly says nothing to suggest that retributivism has been the dominant theory of punishment for several decades now.[3]

Of course, whether Brooks uses "wicked" or "seriously morally wrong", the legal retributivist may reject his claim. The legal retributivist may say that we must first distinguish between a) reasons for punishing this thief less than that murderer and b) reasons for setting statutory penalties for theft and murder. A judge should punish this thief less than that murderer because the statutory scheme requires it (supposing it does). In contrast, the statutory scheme should set a lower penalty for theft than for murder because the legislature wants a potential criminal choosing between theft and murder to choose theft rather than murder. Neither the judge nor the legislature need consider "wickedness" (or the like). Certainly, nothing in legal retributivism requires us to say, for example, that we are justified in punishing driving with an expired license because so driving is "wicked" (or even seriously morally wrong).

Perhaps one reason Brooks overlooked this characteristic of legal retributivism is, oddly enough, that his own "unified theory" seems to require something much like wickedness in all crimes (a rights violation). So, for example, Brooks claims (when first presenting the unified theory) that:

Crimes are rights violations that threaten the substantial freedoms protected by law. Punishment is a response to crime. Punishment [all punishment strictly speaking] aims at the protection of legal rights threatened by crime. (128)

We can, of course, agree that rights violation is characteristic of most crimes central to the criminal law (murder, mayhem, robbery, and so on). We should, however, not agree that it is a characteristic of all crimes, especially regulatory crimes such as driving with an expired license -- or, at least, should not agree to that without an argument Brooks never gives.

One possible argument for Brooks' moralism (or, rather, his "rightism"), one which he implicitly rules out, is the trivial one of letting almost anything count as a right. Brooks instead defines "rights" as "substantial freedoms that are protected by criminalizing their violation" (130). There can be no rights where there is no freedom to be protected or where the freedom, though protectable, is not substantial. So, for example, there is no right protected when criminalizing driving with an expired license because the law in question does not protect a substantial freedom (since driving only with other licensed drivers is not a substantial freedom, though it is a freedom of a sort). What is true of minor regulatory offenses like driving with an expired license seems to be true as well of some more serious crimes, such as bestiality (where the animal does not suffer) or bigamy (where the marriage partners are happy to share). Since these felonies, though common enough in statute books, seem not to involve a rights violation (in Brooks' sense), Brooks' claim that the unified theory "makes best sense of our current practices" seems doubtful (in that respect at least) (148).[4]

The unified theory has other problems as well. One is that it has at least three importantly different formulations. The first, cited above, is that punishment "aims at the protection of individual legal rights threatened by crime" (128). The second is that "punishment is a response to crime that aims at the restoration of rights" (133). The third is that punishment aims at both "the protection and restoration of rights" (130). This is confusing, but the confusion is, I think, only superficial. Rights can, of course, be protected before they are violated, but they cannot be restored until violated. Brooks might, then, have been clearer had he distinguished explicitly between the purpose of statutory penalties (protecting rights) and the purpose of individual punishments (restoring the rights that a particular crime violated). And, having done that, he could have offered a single justifying aim for a system of punishment, that is, to help preserve the substantial freedoms the law recognized.

Brooks' theory would then be unified in the way that many theories are, that is, it would have a single general justifying aim at each level -- system, statute, and criminal case -- though not necessarily the same aim. While this interpretation of what Brooks says would avoid the confusion noted, it would leave open the question why Brooks should call his theory "theunified theory". It is, in this respect, no more unified than some others. And, indeed, Brooks claims another sort of unity altogether. The unified theory is, he claims, uniquely unified insofar as it brings together several different "goals" (desert, proportion, deterrence, and so on) in a "coherent penal pluralism" (133). The coherence that concerns him is, however, not clearly penal. Consider this example:

Suppose there is a violent psychopath. . . . suffering from psychopathic delusions that compel him to attempt killing innocent persons without provocation. . . . The unified theory of punishment might argue that [he] should be incapacitated regardless of his culpability. His actions represent real threats to the rights of others. The aim of punishment is to restore and protect rights and so incapacitation may be required. (140-141)

Let us agree that such a psychopath should be locked up somewhere until he is successfully treated. Locking him up until cured is necessary to protect the public. The question, however, is not whether he should be locked up but whether he should be punished. Even if the aim of punishment is to restore or protect rights, it does not follow that every act of restoring or protecting rights is punishment. Brooks began his book by accepting Hart's definition of "punishment". That definition requires that the punishment "be for breaking the law" (1). While breaking the law (the attempted killing) is the occasion for incapacitating the psychopath, the resulting incapacitation is to be for the risk he poses (the threat to the rights of others), not because he broke the law (since we are assuming he may not be "culpable"). The authorities should undertake civil procedures to incapacitate him for the threat he poses once they have good enough evidence of that threat, even if he had yet to commit any crime, even an attempt. Brooks thus seems to have confused a theory of punishment proper (which presupposes culpability) with a more general theory of enforcement (which does not). There are many ways to enforce standards of conduct beside punishment, some of which do not presuppose culpability, for example, locked doors, straightjackets, and drug therapy.[5]

Brooks has a good deal to say about some of these other modes of enforcement, especially in Punishment's second half. That is one of the attractions of the book. My only objection to these digressions into general enforcement is that they are digressions, not anything relevant to punishment theory as such, even according to the unified theory. Which brings me back to the conclusion of Punishment quoted at the beginning of this review: "If you care about justice, then you should care about punishment" (216). The book's index has no listing for "justice" and, in fact, there is no attempt anywhere in the book explicitly to connect the unified theory with justice. There are only many brief references to "desert", mostly in asides critical of (moral) retributivism.

[1] The Code of Hammurabi, (accessed December 16, 2013).

[2] Herbert Morris, "Persons and Punishment," The Monist 52 (1968): 475-501; Michael Davis, To Make the Punishment Fit the Crime (Westview Press: Boulder, CO: 1992). Brooks cites neither work.‎

[3] For evidence for this claim, see Michael Davis, "Punishment Theory's Golden Age: A Survey of Developments from (about) 1957 to 2007", Journal of Ethics 13 (March 2009): 73-100.

[4] These are my examples, not Brooks'. I chose them to avoid Brooks' claim that victimless crimes (such as prostitution or possession of illegal drugs) can be justified insofar as the criminal violates her own rights (139-140) -- a controversial justification, but not absurd. In contrast, there is no substantial (widely recognized) right that either bestiality or bigamy (limited to facts such as I assumed) could be said to violate. The criminal statutes in question do, of course, themselves constitute substantial deprivations of freedom (as criminal statutes generally do) -- which is why we need a theory of legislation to provide a framework of justification.

[5] For more on enforcement, especially the distinction between enforcement and punishment, see Mark R. Reiff, Punishment, Compensation, and Law: A Theory of Enforceability(Cambridge University Press: Cambridge, 2005).