Purpose in the Universe: The moral and metaphysical case for Ananthropocentric Purposivism

Placeholder book cover

Tim Mulgan, Purpose in the Universe: The Moral and Metaphysical Case for Ananthropocentric Purposivism, Oxford University Press, 2015, 435pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199646142.

Reviewed by Joshua W. Seachris, University of Notre Dame


In this ground-breaking, far-reaching, and carefully-argued book, Tim Mulgan puts a previously underdeveloped view on a conceptual-dialectical map largely dominated by theism and naturalism. This view he calls "ananthropocentric purposivism" (AP). AP is the view that, contra atheism, the universe has a purpose, but, contra benevolent theism (BT), that purpose is non-human-centered. Put simply, there is a cosmic purpose, but humans are irrelevant to that purpose. Mulgan contends that we live in a religiously ambiguous universe where the available evidence reasonably can be understood in profoundly different ways by humans (hence, the presence of both theistic and atheistic interpretations of the world). He claims that a more careful look at that evidence should prompt us to take AP seriously, and may even tip the scales in favor of AP over both BT and atheism. In Purpose in the Universe he takes this more careful look.

Mulgan follows a four-step dialectical strategy. After providing a helpful prolegomenon in Chapter 1, he turns to meta-ethics, and defends a non-naturalist version of moral objectivism in Chapter 2. Next, he enlists a cluster of classic theistic arguments -- cosmological, teleological, mystical, ontological -- to support the conclusion that there is cosmic purpose (Chapters 3-6). He then turns his attention to atheistic arguments -- arguments from scale, evil, religious diversity, and metaphysical and normative problems with immortality -- to support the conclusion that this purpose is non-human-centered (Chapters 7-10). Finally, he explores practical implications of AP (Chapters 11-13).

In Chapter 2, Mulgan defends a non-naturalist moral semantics against both non-cognitivism and moral naturalism, and he defends moral realism against moral nihilism. His intentions are clear: challenge the naturalism upon which much of contemporary meta-ethical theorization is built. He concludes the chapter by advancing a moral argument for BT that AP can borrow. He shares the view with advocates of various moral arguments for theism that both moral truth and moral knowledge are grounded in God or in G* (some AP functional equivalent where AP is consistent with either personal purpose or the impersonal purpose of views like Platonism or axiarchism). That is to say, there is objective value and such value makes no metaphysical sense in a purely materialist universe. Moral facts, according to Mulgan, are essential to explain why our universe exists (S), why it is friendly to life (FL), and that such facts require G*, though not full-blown BT.

In Chapters 3-6 ("The Case against Atheism"), Mulgan builds his case for cosmic purpose by defending what he considers to be the strongest formulations of classic theistic arguments. He thinks versions of the cosmological, teleological, mystical, and ontological arguments support the conclusion that G* (and G*'s cosmic purposes) are the best explanation for:

1. S: why there is something rather than absolutely nothing.
2. FL: why our universe is friendly to life.
3. MDP: the presence and nature of mystical doxastic practices that provide epistemic access to the link between perfection and objective values via mystical experience.

As he develops and defends these arguments, and as he considers the most formidable naturalistic counter-explanations of S, FL, and MDP (including appeals to brute fact, theories of everything, multi-verse explanations, and deflationary accounts among others), Mulgan leaves few stones unturned. Theists who nonetheless do not embrace AP will appreciate his effort to defend arguments from the classic theistic corpus. This is only Part I, however; Part II lurks. Here, he switches sides and aligns himself, partly, with atheists.

In Chapters 7-10 ("The Case against Benevolent Theism"), Mulgan enlists the most formidable atheistic arguments in order to support, not atheism, but the conclusion that the cosmic purpose is not human-centered. Chapters 3-6 provide good grounds for thinking there is a cosmic purpose, so atheism is already off the table. Careful attention to arguments from scale, evil, religious diversity, and problems with immortality, when considered in relation to earlier arguments for theism, show -- less metaphysically ambitious than atheism but perhaps even more emotionally counter-intuitive and unsettling -- that there is a G*, but G* does not care for human beings, either individually or collectively. The difference between the atheist-inference and the AP-inference is noteworthy. According to AP, the most reasonable inference from the standard atheistic arguments is not:

Atheist-Inference: our epistemic, religious, and overall existential predicament is so precarious that there is very likely no supernatural realm at all.

Rather, it is:

AP-Inference: our epistemic, religious, and overall existential predicament is so precarious because we're simply not relevant to the cosmic purpose.

According to AP, both BT and atheism are too parochially-focused in elevating the place of humans and human concerns in the cosmic scheme of things. Such focus leads atheists to think that the material universe is all there is, and theists to think that there is a loving, omni-competent parent who cares about us down to the very hairs on our heads.

Mulgan concludes (Part III, Chapters 11-13) by considering a number of ethical and practical matters. In Chapter 11, he introduces a series of fictional characters who have converted to AP from either BT or atheism. Each explains salient factors that led to her or his conversion, and discusses how AP impacts life. In Chapter 12, he defends AP against the charge that it makes no space for human well-being in virtue of (1) AP's austere ethic, and (2) AP's largely severing human cares and concerns from the cosmic purpose. He explores the impact of AP on moral theories, primarily consequentialist theories, in Chapter 13.

Mulgan's arduous journey through wide-ranging philosophical material is nuanced and aims to be even-handed. I cannot possibly do justice to the range and subtlety of his many arguments in a book review, nor can I critically interact at every place where I think it would be dialectically beneficial. I will raise a few critical points, and close by issuing a challenge to both theist and naturalist philosophers of religion.

The heart of AP is the twofold claim that there is a cosmic purpose but that humans are irrelevant to it. G* does not care about us -- at all. Mulgan employs several formidable atheistic arguments to sanction this second conjunct: scale, evil, religious diversity, and the normative and metaphysical problems attending to the idea of immortality. G* does not care about us because if G* did, we would possess more cosmic prominence (not to be read strictly in terms of size), we would not suffer such horrendous evils, the religious situation vis-à-vis beliefs about the existence and nature of G* would be much less, shall we say, messy, and the path to immortality for creatures like ourselves would not be littered with so many obstacles. Additionally, if G* cared about humans, our various rational, emotional, and normative capacities would be far superior to those we now possess (I will call this the "Capacities Argument" (CA), which is a corollary to the argument from scale).

A tension surfaces if one focuses on CA as a reason to favor AP. AP's claim that humans are irrelevant to the cosmic purpose could apply to any rational, created beings in the universe, regardless of their level of superiority in relation to us. For any finite rational being, one could run the AP argument that this being is irrelevant to the cosmic purpose because superior rational beings with closer positioning and attunement to God and cosmic value are possible. Given the chasm of distance between any finite being and God, the argument can be continually generated. If humans are not already relevant to the cosmic purpose in virtue of our limited capacities, then why think that a higher being with greater, but still limited, capacities is relevant, for still greater finite beings are possible? If a rational finite being with finite access to the divine nature and purposes can be cared for (and, I submit, that one can be existentially concerned about being cared for by something or someone that has the power to speak to our common human condition without having an inflated sense of self-importance), then we humans might as well be numbered among those who are relevant. Here, of course, is where Mulgan will likely appeal to the argument from evil as positive evidence that we are, in fact, not cared for. CA, then, gets supplemented by the argument from evil. And, whereas Mulgan would argue the chances of a successful theodicy are dim for our species, far advanced creatures may have recourse to a successful theodicy given their very different predicament.

This brings me to a second, related worry. To conclude that human beings are irrelevant to the cosmic purpose via a glimpse at their present state is truncated. A complete, diachronic look at the entire arc of human and cosmic history in a theistic tradition like Christianity includes creation, fall, and redemption. To focus on our present condition (framed saliently by limitation, strife, and suffering) without considering our future end omits important parts of the human story. Consider a doctrine like deification that one finds in both Eastern and Western Christianity (and even in someone like Calvin). As humans participate in greater and greater measures of the divine life, we will continue on a trajectory of becoming increasingly advanced in our imago dei capacities. Therefore, to ask whether or not humans are relevant to the cosmic purpose, one must narrate more of our story than just up to the present. Framed by the experience of never-ending love, joy, and fecundity fueled by increased capacities realized in the eschaton, we are faring much better vis-à-vis our relationship to cosmic purpose. Mulgan, of course, is not left without recourse to a response. Here, he will be inclined to raise again the various problems for post-mortem existence, reminding us that he thinks the chances of such existence for us are tenuous at best.

This, though, leads to my penultimate point. Settling these issues is inextricably connected with the merits and/or demerits of the various arguments for and against BT that Mulgan has carefully canvassed in this work. If he is correct about the precariousness of post-mortem existence, if he is correct that the argument from evil substantiates the claim that we are not cared for by G*, then the above worries are less worrisome. I assess the strength of the case for BT to be higher and the strength of the case against BT to be lower than he does. Related to the above worries, I am more optimistic about the prospects for defense and theodicy (Mulgan's AP project requires theodicy) and post-mortem survival. Recall also that the book begins by assuming religious ambiguity: "Our universe is religiously ambiguous." This is, no doubt, a view that many philosophers, non-philosophers, theists (and adherents of other religious views), and naturalists alike share. I should register my dissent though, and say that I am sympathetic to various sorts of denials of religious ambiguity, whether outright denials or weaker claims about the evidential state of affairs being much less ambiguous than many think. This is controversial, I know, and can come across as epistemically naïve or, worse, arrogant. Yet, one will find theistic and atheistic philosophers who do question religious ambiguity at some level, arguing that their worldview is significantly favored by the cumulative evidence. To question religious ambiguity is to call into question Mulgan's project from the outset. Even Mulgan questions the strongest versions of religious ambiguity since he thinks the evidence -- even if only minimally -- favors AP over BT and atheism.

I close by issuing a Purpose in the Universe-inspired challenge to my theist and naturalist colleagues in philosophy of religion. I am a theist within the Christian tradition. While I have by no means come close to reading the entire, and ever-expanding, theistic-naturalistic dialectical corpus, I am quite familiar with the overall contours and many of the specifics of that body of work. Naturalists, many of whom are more familiar with this corpus than I am, can say the same. This is a debate that has spanned centuries, and philosophers of religion are well acquainted with it. But here is the danger (I'll speak for myself): with such familiarity it is easy to become immunized against the real force of our interlocutors' arguments. We have seen them so many times in their various iterations in journal after journal after monograph, that we can become desensitized to formidable epistemic merits that they may possess. This is where someone like Mulgan enters and, by introducing a new interlocutor (AP) into the dialectical landscape, wields old arguments in new hands. New hands can present the well-worn arguments of a field at a slightly different angle, perhaps revealing something new and surprising. We should, therefore, pay careful attention to this intriguing contribution to the field.