Pursuing Equal Opportunities: The Theory and Practice of Egalitarian Justice

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Jacobs, Lesley A., Pursuing Equal Opportunities: The Theory and Practice of Egalitarian Justice, Cambridge, 2004, 294pp, $ 24.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521530210.

Reviewed by John Baker, University College, Dublin


Lesley Jacobs’s aim is to set out a three-dimensional model of equal opportunities and to apply it to a number of policy areas involving race, class and gender. He argues that the point of equal opportunity principles is to regulate competitive procedures that distribute scarce resources. Since not all questions of justice involve competitive procedures, and since competitions vary in character, it is important to talk about equal opportunities in the plural and to insist that equality of opportunity does not constitute an all-encompassing theory of justice. The three dimensions of equal opportunity identify three different aspects of fair competitions. First, competitions need to be procedurally fair: to have fair rules of engagement. Secondly, they must take place against fair background conditions, so that the parties enter them on a level playing field. Finally, they must have fair stakes, i.e. the gains and losses to winners and losers should be fair.

Jacobs applies the model to a number of important social policy issues. Under the heading of race, he argues that the point of civil-rights legislation is to ensure background fairness, while affirmative action focuses on stakes fairness. In relation to class, he defends workfare as a means of achieving stakes fairness and argues that the best way to justify universal health care is to avoid the idea of equal opportunity altogether. On gender, he defends affirmative action as an instrument of background fairness but pay equity (comparable worth) as one of stakes fairness. He argues that the best framework for divorce settlements is to promote equality between the parties in their post-divorce opportunities.

One of the strengths of this book is its thorough interdisciplinarity. Its overall structure testifies to its engagement with the realities of race, class and gender. In its detail it moves confidently through philosophical, legal, sociological and economic treatments of inequality. The book is also valuable for drawing on Canadian experience in addition to the US and UK examples that many readers may find more familiar.

The central theoretical innovation of the book is the third dimension of equal opportunity, stakes fairness. Jacobs is surely right to maintain that whether the outcome of a competition is fair is not exhausted by establishing that it followed fair procedures and took place between fairly situated participants: one must also ask if the pay-offs assigned to winners and losers are themselves fair. I am not sure I agree with the claim that this question is really an aspect of equal opportunity rather than a distinct issue of justice, but that is perhaps a secondary matter. A more important problem is establishing criteria for stakes fairness in each context. For example, Jacobs deploys stakes fairness in his discussion of workfare to argue that the current distribution of benefits and burdens generated by the labour market is unfair. Specifically, it is unfair for the unemployed to get not only much less income than employees but also none of the other benefits of employment such as better health, higher self-esteem and wider social networks. Our response to unemployment should therefore extend beyond supporting decent levels of welfare payments to providing access to jobs. But Jacobs’s judgement that current outcomes are unfair, and his suggestion that providing minimum-wage employment would be fair, are both taken for granted. If stakes fairness really matters, we surely need a clearer account of what it is.

Jacobs devotes Chapter 3 to defending equal opportunity against the “Rawlsian” charge that it magnifies “natural inequalities.” His argument that the very idea of natural inequalities is a myth makes a very useful contribution to the literature. Inequality is the result of social structures: the only thing that exists naturally is human diversity. But is this enough to get equal opportunity off the hook? It remains the case that competitive procedures produce unequal outcomes that reflect to some degree the innate differences between competitors. So Rawls’s fundamental objection still applies: because these differences are morally arbitrary, so are the inequalities they contribute to. It is hard to see how the objection can be avoided without adopting one of two strategies. The first, taken by Arneson, Cohen and Roemer, is to make equal opportunity hinge on personal responsibility and to maintain that inequalities are justified if and only if they reflect features for which individuals are responsible. The second, taken by Rawls himself, is to acknowledge that inequalities reflect moral arbitraries but to justify them in terms of their benefits for the least well off. Jacobs explicitly rejects both strategies, but I do not see how he can then defend his own view.

Jacobs’s applications of the three-dimension model are too detailed to be discussed thoroughly here. Overall, the discussions are very interesting and full of content, but I wonder whether they vindicate his model. For example, in Chapter 5 Jacobs defends race-based affirmative action in terms of stakes fairness, while in Chapter 8 he defends gender-based affirmative action in terms of background fairness. Is there really such a clear difference between the two cases? Jacobs’s own justification of race-based affirmative action hinges on the relatively low human capital possessed by African Americans as they enter the labour market. That looks to me more like an issue of background fairness than stakes fairness according to the model’s own framework. A similar problem arises in the discussion of pay equity, which again is characterized as an issue of stakes fairness. The argument seems to be that because women enter the labour market under the burden of having primary responsibility for domestic labour - what Hochschild dubs the “second shift” - it is unfair for the jobs they typically undertake to be paid less than the jobs typically done by men. But if the source of this inequality is the background condition of the household division of labour, then surely it is an issue of background fairness, not stakes fairness. Since it would be rash to suggest that the author cannot apply his own framework, I can only conclude that the framework itself is less helpful than it should be.

A rather different problem arises in connection with divorce. Jacobs maintains that divorce is an appropriate field for applying the idea of equal opportunities because the divorcing parties compete over the terms of the settlement. The fairest way to settle, he argues, is not to aim for equal standards of living but to promote equal opportunities post-divorce. The problem is that this solution, instead of applying the idea of equal opportunity to the divorce competition itself, uses it only as a criterion for a fair settlement. But in that case, divorce is not, after all, a competitive procedure with no “preconceived winner or outcome” (14). Equal opportunity may be relevant to divorce, but not, it seems, in the way the author originally intended.

As anyone who has attempted to apply principles to practice will realize, the justification of any particular policy involves a number of significant steps with room for argument at every point. So it is not surprising to find conclusions here that one may disagree with. What Jacobs himself characterizes as a “maverick” position is his support for workfare, based on the claim that it is unfair for the losers in the labour market to miss out on the non-pecuniary benefits of employment. That certainly justifies a right to work, but I am not convinced that it supports a policy of workfare. For one thing, it neglects the fact that a great deal of work takes place outside the labour market. It also subjects its targets to a level of compulsion that in my view is far more serious than the other types of compulsion with which Jacobs compares it, namely compulsory schooling and social insurance. In his chapter on divorce, Jacobs shows a great deal of sympathy with the divorced doctor who would rather be a sidewalk artist (249). I think he should sympathize a bit more with the unemployed worker who would rather not flip hamburgers.

One of the central claims of the book is that the idea of equal opportunities is only applicable to cases of competition for scarce resources. That claim is plausible if “resources” is read broadly enough to include such prizes as satisfying work, educational opportunities, status and power. Jacobs employs the claim to argue that neither the distribution of health care nor relations within families are proper subjects for an equal opportunity treatment, because neither of these spheres is (ideally, anyway) a sphere of competition. But even if we accept that argument, it does not follow that arrangements in these spheres are exempt from egalitarian principles of justice. To my mind, Jacobs too easily identifies the whole of egalitarianism with the idea of equal opportunity, with the consequence that all other issues of justice are taken to fall under some other concept. I think he is right to assert that equal opportunity has a limited role in judging justice, but wrong to think that equality is irrelevant to what remains. Pursuing equal opportunities is only one aspect of egalitarian justice.

Overall, this is a very interesting and thought-provoking book. There is plenty to argue with, but it sets out a theoretical perspective and range of applications that have to be taken seriously by anyone working on the theory and practice of equality.