Pursuing Meaning

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Emma Borg, Pursuing Meaning, Oxford University Press, 2012, 224pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199588374.

Reviewed by Allyson Mount, Keene State College


It is raining semantic theories, and Emma Borg is ready.

The recent proliferation of indexicalist and contextualist views, examples of "incomplete" propositions, and proposals for distinguishing between semantics and pragmatics has (to put it mildly) obscured the semantic landscape. In Pursuing Meaning, Borg brings order and focus to the debate, responding to a deluge of objections from multiple perspectives. She provides a systematic and thorough defense of semantic minimalism against challenges raised by indexicalism, contextualism, and occasionalism, highlighting the relationship of minimalism to different variations of these views and to major debates about the semantics/pragmatics divide, context-shifting arguments, and intuitions of semantic incompleteness. The scope and clarity of the book are impressive.

Those familiar with Borg's work will recognize that Pursuing Meaning comes less than a decade after the publication of her previous book on the same topic, Semantic Minimalism (Oxford, 2004). While there is considerable overlap between the two and her ultimate conclusion is essentially the same, Borg has refocused her arguments with a different emphasis, in response to developments in the intervening years. As she notes, when Minimal Semantics was written she was engaged in "primarily a two-headed debate" (xiv) with contextualism and minimalism as the main competitors, but since then various forms of indexicalism have gained force and offered additional alternatives. She aims to clarify the relationship between these alternatives and the extent to which each poses a genuine challenge to semantic minimalism.

The book consists of an illuminating preface and six chapters. Borg begins by identifying four defining features of the semantic minimalist position. The first two -- that semantic content for well-formed declarative sentences is truth-evaluable, and that semantic content for a sentence is fully determined by its syntactic structure and lexical content -- are traditional tenets of formal semantics. Semantic content, she says, "is exclusively paved with syntactic footholds" (88). The remaining two claims -- that there are only a limited number of context-sensitive expressions in natural language, and that semantic content is recoverable without access to current speaker intentions -- are also defining features of semantic minimalism (4-5), but ones that she prefers to see as following from a commitment to a formal semantic approach, rather than as basic assumptions of minimalism itself.

Next, Borg addresses the apparent problem presented by context-shifting arguments like those discussed in Cappelen & Lepore 2005 (Insensitive Semantics, Oxford: Blackwell). She readily acknowledges that context-shifting arguments do highlight an issue that needs explanation, and she does not trivialize the challenge. Still, she argues that semantic minimalism is the only viable alternative to a fully use-based semantic theory; indexicalism, contextualism, and relativism have no principled way to accept context-shifting arguments as semantically significant without opening the door to being "overwhelmed by a tsunami of pragmatic content, eroding entirely the semantics/pragmatics distinction" (16). The slippery slope worry is familiar from recent literature, and Borg presents it forcefully and repeatedly throughout the book.

At first it is hard to keep straight what she means by 'indexicalism' and 'contextualism', since her categorization of views does not always match how the positions are labeled in other literature. However, that is hardly her fault -- as she notes, those labels have been used in different ways, with different emphases, and one of her aims is to clear up some of the confusion by articulating what she sees as the defining features of each view. Laying out the relationship between views is an ambitious undertaking, and Borg has accomplished it to a remarkable degree, though only time will tell if her terminology will become standard.

It is a theme throughout Pursuing Meaning that semantic theories have been unfairly saddled with the responsibility of explaining phenomena that are not genuinely semantic. She asserts that "there are good reasons to think that it is simply a mistake to require a semantic theory to be answerable to intuitions about speech act content" (15). But while this may be a reasonable position to take in general, it does place a heavy burden on semantic minimalists to identify a distinct explanatory use for minimal propositions. This is a burden she does not fully discharge. At times her argument for the usefulness of minimal propositions appears almost circular: we need to recognize a level of truth-evaluable, intention-free propositional content because that is the only kind of content that can form the basis of a Fodorian, computational model of linguistic comprehension, and a computational model is the only type acceptable to a semantic formalist. Needless to say, someone not inclined toward semantic formalism in the first place will hardly find this reasoning convincing.

However, in Chapter 2 Borg puts an interesting spin on the question by examining the relationship between semantics and psychology. She subscribes to a metaphysical version of the view that semantic facts depend on psychological facts, accepting the idea that semantics should capture the knowledge needed for ordinary language users to grasp linguistic meaning. The corresponding epistemic claim that "the route to a correct semantic theory runs via an account of the contents of the minds of language users" (55) seems to pose a problem for minimalists, since psychological evidence does not support the view that hearers must consciously consider the minimal proposition expressed in order to figure out the speaker's meaning. In her attempt to reconcile this apparent incongruity, Borg asserts that there must be mind/brain structures that represent word meanings, syntactic rules, and semantic rules for determining sentence meanings from word meanings and syntax (63). Thus, she concludes, minimalism is open to confirmation or disconfirmation by psychological evidence in principle, though not on the level of processing particular utterances. This was one of the most thought-provoking parts of the book, though her arguments here are less developed than some readers might wish.

In Chapter 3, Borg responds to arguments against propositionalism (a term borrowed from Bach), the view that every well-formed declarative sentence can express a complete proposition relative to a context of utterance. Borg rejects the claim that so-called "incomplete expressions" (such as 'It is raining' and 'Flintoff is ready') give us reason to abandon propositionalism, and she argues that a semantic minimalist has several viable options for responding to different types of apparent counterexamples. She allows that an indexical-based strategy may be correct for explaining some cases, while an ambiguity approach or a syntax-based context-sensitivity approach may explain others. Yet other problem cases, she says, may simply result from misplaced intuitions. While she does suggest a plausible motivation for each of these responses, her discussion of the incompleteness argument feels ad hoc in a way the rest of the book doesn't. This is not necessarily a strike against her view -- perhaps the phenomenon is just messy in a way that requires such a variety of explanations. But the responses she offers to these "problem cases" are not entirely satisfying due to their lack of unity.

In Chapter 4, Borg undertakes the difficult task of explaining how a semantic minimalist can reconcile propositionalism with the fact that the semantics of demonstratives (and perhaps other lexically-marked context-sensitive expressions) seems to depend on speaker intentions. This is the area in which her arguments are least compelling. She argues that access to speaker intentions is required for reference-fixing but not for grasp of semantic content, and that it is enough for linguistic understanding that the hearer can recognize a demonstrative's character in a token-reflexive way. A more substantive grasp of the content of the utterance, Borg claims, is not required by semantics itself.

As she recognizes, detractors will find this view deeply problematic. How could a hearer grasp a singular proposition without being able to identify what object it is about in a substantive, non-linguistic way? Borg acknowledges that semantic minimalism looks very minimal indeed, especially with respect to demonstratives. One could have semantic knowledge of an utterance involving demonstratives without being able to attach those demonstratives to anything in the world. While she attempts to present this as just a reiteration of a basic minimalist commitment, it seems to deny rather than explain the force of the arguments that led to the objection in the first place. Again, it brings to the forefront the larger question of what the usefulness of minimal propositions is supposed to be.

In Chapter 5, Borg approaches the question of whether minimal propositions really exist from a different angle. She considers whether Chomsky's semantic internalism, which seems to share some of the same motivations as minimalism, is really compatible with the minimalist view. Her answer is no. The third tenet of minimalism -- that there are only a limited number of context-sensitive expressions in natural language -- seems to commit the minimalist to a broadly referential, externalist view of word meanings so that declarative sentences yield truth-evaluable propositions. But this position is not without its difficulties. Ontological questions loom large, since there are no clear and consistent ways of individuating either words or objects in the world. Borg's response again illustrates how minimal her minimalism is: she suggests that being able to determine whether a particular object falls under a certain concept is unnecessary for semantic understanding, and she concludes that internalist positions may indeed contain some important insights, but that ultimately they are not strong enough to justify abandoning a referentialist commitment.

Acknowledging the need for a more robust response to internalist arguments, but still aiming to preserve the central tenets of semantic minimalism, Borg devotes the last chapter to a view she calls "organizational lexical semantics" (OLS). She agrees that word meanings cannot just be a matter of simple pairings of words and denotations, since this would not explain polysemy, synonomy, or other common intra-linguistic phenomena. Instead, she considers two potential responses to the internalist challenge, both of which involve some sort of lexical complexity. First is the view that word meanings are "complex bundles of semantic features" (177), where the particular features in a bundle govern the ways a specific term can interact with others. Second is the view that word meanings are constituted by a term's inferential relations. Borg addresses objections from Fodor and Lepore that no view based on lexical complexity can be correct because it is non-compositional. But, Borg argues, that objection assumes that views based on lexical complexity require a commitment to the idea that word meanings decompose. OLS, as she presents it, is based on a weaker type of lexical complexity that does not reject compositionality.

The final sections of the book are dedicated to addressing various objections to OLS and arguing that it is compatible with semantic minimalism, though she refrains from fully endorsing OLS as the only plausible view of word meaning. While Borg does make a compelling case that OLS can address the internalist arguments, and that it is indeed compatible with minimalism, she ends up with a position that sounds much more like indexicalism than she initially led the reader to expect. She points out, accurately, that minimalism and indexicalism are motivated by quite different concerns and methodologies. Still, her conclusion that a semantic minimalist view of sentence meaning is compatible with an OLS view of word meaning, and that these positions together are still significantly different from indexicalism, sits a bit uncomfortably with the spirit of the rest of the book.

Borg writes in an exceptionally clear and often witty style. Pursuing Meaning is lively, full of interesting turns of phrase, and detailed in content. Throughout the book, Borg addresses questions about the usefulness and underlying plausibility of minimalism head-on, offering positive reasons for being a minimalist, rather than leaving her arguments to stand or fall based exclusively on how well she defends minimalism against objections. Overall, Pursuing Meaning has a proactive rather than reactive tone, which helps draw along readers who are initially disinclined to support her position. Given the depth of disagreement over the semantics/pragmatics divide, that, in itself, is a major achievement.