In this book Matthew Tugby offers a new theory of natural modality, where natural modality is understood to consist of those possibilities and necessities arising from the laws of nature and the behavioural dispositions of things (1). The basic idea in Tugby’s theory, Modal Platonism, is that the dispositions of things are grounded in relations of dispositional directedness between Platonic universals, i.e., universals that need not be instantiated in order to exist. For instance, the disposition to break of a fragile vase consists in its instantiating the universal fragility, which bears a relation of dispositional directedness to the universal breaking. Universals, for Tugby, have a non-dispositional, qualitative essence, and it is in virtue of these essences that relations of dispositional directedness exist between them. The relations of dispositional directedness are internal, in the sense that they ‘automatically exist as soon as their relata exist’ (27), since they are necessarily generated by the qualitative universals that they relate (31). The book can be seen as a complex argument for Modal Platonism, an argument that consists in showing how Modal Platonism is in a better position to deal with several problems affecting its alternatives.
Much of Tugby’s book is spent on arguing against alternative theories of natural modality and, in particular, Aristotelian views which take dispositions to be relations of dispositional directedness between immanent universals, that is, universals that obey the Principle of Instantiation, according to which, necessarily, for each n-adic universal U there exist at least n particulars such that they instantiate U (cf. 167).
I have doubts about the cogency of Tugby’s arguments against Aristotelianism. Let me explain why.
Tugby’s argument against Aristotelian theories of dispositions is that these are inconsistent with the Intrinsicness Principle, according to which many dispositions are intrinsic to their possessors, where a property P is intrinsic to x if and only if x’s having P is independent of the existence of distinct particulars and x’s relation to them (56). But, Tugby argues, the Aristotelian theory is inconsistent with the claim that fragility is intrinsic. For consider a fragile vase that never breaks—if nothing else ever broke, the vase would still be fragile. But, on the Aristotelian theory, if nothing at all ever broke, the manifestation universal of breaking would not exist, and so nothing would be fragile, given that dispositions are based on a relation of dispositional directedness between the dispositional universal and the manifestation universal. Thus, Tugby concludes that on Aristotelianism, fragility is not intrinsic to the vase, since on Aristotelianism there are two possible situations in which the vase is qualitatively the same but in one of them it is fragile and in the other it is not (57–8). There is nothing unique about fragility, and so the argument generalizes to the effect that if Aristotelianism is true, then the Intrinsicness Principle is false.
But Tugby’s argument does not show that, on Aristotelianism, fragility is not intrinsic. For Tugby, as I said, a property P is intrinsic to x if and only if x’s having P is independent of the existence of distinct particulars and x’s relation to them. On this conception a property is not intrinsic to a particular x if and only if x’s having it depends on the existence of distinct particulars or x’s relation to them. Let us assume that whenever two particulars exist, they are related by the relation of coexistence. Thus, we can simplify and say that a property is not intrinsic to a particular x if and only if x’s having it depends on x’s relation to other particulars. Now, x’s having P depends on x’s relation to other particulars if and only if there are no two possible situations in which x is related to the same particulars in the same way but in one of them x has P and in the other one it does not. For example, x’s being fragile depends on x’s relation to other particulars if and only if there are no two possible situations in which x is related to the same particulars in the same way but in one of them x is fragile and in the other one it is not. But nothing in Tugby’s example rules out the two possibilities as follows: in both of them the vase is related to the same particulars in the same way, but in one of them the vase is fragile due to its internal microstructure, and in the other one it is not fragile due to a difference in it its internal microstructure. If such situations are possible, then fragility is intrinsic to the vase. So, if Aristotelianism can accommodate such situations, Aristotelianism is not incompatible with the fragility of the vase. But Tugby has not shown that Aristotelianism cannot accommodate such situations, and there is no reason to think that it cannot.
What Tugby has shown is that, on an Aristotelian conception of universals, there is a situation in which a fragile vase never breaks and another situation in which the same vase is not fragile because in that situation nothing, not even the vase itself, breaks. But this does not show that fragility is not intrinsic. For the fragility does not depend on how the vase is related to other particulars, but on whether any particular, including the vase itself, breaks. For what fragility ultimately depends on in the kind of theory Tugby is considering is the existence of the universal fragility, which on this theory depends on the existence of something or another breaking. We could also consider the following two possible situations: in one of them the vase breaks because it is fragile, and nothing else ever breaks; in the other the vase does not break, and this is the only difference between the two situations. On the theory considered by Tugby the vase is not fragile in the second situation, since the universal breaking does not exist in it. But then the fragility of the vase does not depend on how the vase relates to other particulars, since it is related to them in the same way in both situations. So, if Aristotelianism is consistent with these two situations, and I see no reason why it is not, then Aristotelianism does not conflict with the intrinsic character of fragility. Since the point generalises to other intrinsic dispositions, there is no reason to think Aristotelianism conflicts with the Intrinsicness Principle.
Tugby has another argument against Aristotelian theories, theories like David Armstrong’s and Stephen Mumford’s. This is that such theories are explanatorily unstable (167–70). The argument is that on these theories, universals depend, generically, on the particulars that instantiate them. That is, for any universal to exist, there must be some particular or particulars instantiating it. But, given this, Tugby argues, Aristotelians posit an explanation that goes in the wrong direction, for Aristotelian take universals to explain their instances: “if Armstrongian laws are ontologically dependent on their instances, it is difficult to see how they can at the same time metaphysically explain those instances. Aristotelians like Armstrong seem to be positing an explanation that goes in the wrong direction” (168). Indeed, Tugby thinks that typically, if x metaphysically explains y, y is dependent on x rather than vice versa (167).
Even if one grants Tugby the idea that a metaphysical explanans does not depend on its explanandum, there is a problem in Tugby’s argument, namely that it contains a false premise: indeed, Armstrong and other Aristotelians like Mumford, do not use relations between universals to explain the instances of universals but rather to explain the dispositions and behaviour of such instances. So the universals’ dependence on their instances does not conflict with their explanatory function, since they do not explain those instances.
Despite these problems in the argumentation, Tugby’s book succeeds in clarifying and developing Modal Platonism. Putting Properties First is therefore a very welcome addition to the literature on natural modality, one that will represent a challenge to the alternative theories of natural modality.