Puzzling Identities

Placeholder book cover

Vincent Descombes, Puzzling Identities, Stephen Adam Schwartz (tr.), Harvard University Press, 2016, 211pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674732148.

Reviewed by Franz Knappik, University of Bergen


In his new book, the prominent French philosopher Vincent Descombes explores the notion of identity as it has come to be employed in connection with psychological, moral and social phenomena — for instance, in the context of the “identity crises” of adolescents, of “identity politics” and “identitarian” movements, but also in travel guides that praise how much a neighbourhood has preserved its identity (4f.). The leading question is whether the use of the term “identity” in such contexts can be clarified on the basis of what Descombes dubs the “elementary” sense of “identity”: a sense which says that “there is only a single selfsame thing where one might have thought there to be two” (5). In his overall argument, Descombes reconstructs two non-elementary notions of identity: an “expressive” notion of the identity that modern individuals acquire through a process of self-shaping; and a notion of a group’s identity that is tied to the members’ consciousness of the group and its traditions, and that is primarily exemplified by modern nation-states.

While chapter 1 exposes the problem and demonstrates its current relevance through a series of short case studies — including a discussion of Erik Erikson’s work on “identity crises”, which has made popular the notion of identity in psychological and social contexts, the rest of the book explores relevant notions of “identity”. Chapter 2 discusses the “elementary” sense of identity. Its main claim is that identity is relative to sortal categorizations. Descombes combines here Peter Geach’s grammatical claim that identity statements either explicitly or implicitly always contain sortal terms (“a is the same as b” is short for “a is the same F as b”, with a and b standing for an individual and F for a sortal term that applies to it, 60), and David Wiggins’ metaphysical claim that the identity of an individual depends on what it is, in the Aristotelian sense of its essence or quiddity (Wiggins’ “Sortal Dependency of Individuation”) (61).

Descombes treats the latter two claims as equivalent (61), which is inaccurate. Confusion about this point is further increased when he identifies the revival of Aristotelian essentialism in the context of the metaphysics of identity with an acceptance of nominal essences (61). While Geach at one point of his discussion (1962, 68) does draw on Locke’s notion of a nominal essence, Wiggins (2001, 78) is explicit that his Sortal Dependency of Individuation requires real, not merely nominal essences.

Given the resulting account of elementary identity, one might expect Descombes to develop a view on which the non-elementary forms of identity that he addresses in the rest of the book are a matter of the individuation and persistence of persons and groups, and that the relevant identity criteria can be derived from an understanding of what personhood and grouphood consists in. Such an account is not what one finds in the subsequent chapters, though, and there are good reasons for this. The identity idioms that Descombes is interested in point to something that a person or a group can lose, or fail to possess, or struggle to acquire, while remaining the same person or group in the elementary sense (5). Yet as a consequence, the reader is at a loss to see what precise impact the discussion of the elementary sense of identity in chapter 2 is meant to have on the accounts of identity in the context of moral psychology and social theory that Descombes develops in the rest of the book.

Chapters 3 and 4 address identity talk in the context of the moral psychology of individuals — that is, in the context of the question “who am I?” (62). Descombes starts here from the plausible assumption that an adequate understanding of the sense of “identity” in this context has to take into account the subjective perspective of the individual that is trying to answer the question “who am I?” (67). One model for thus “subjectivizing” identity, explored in chapter 3, is provided by Locke’s account of personal identity (which, as we learn in an insightful discussion, is taken up by Voltaire and Proust). This option is ultimately rejected for the reason that a merely subjective criterion of identity does not provide any criterion at all (86f.).

Instead, chapter 4 develops an alternative strategy, which treats the question “who am I?” as a practical question. On this view, an individual answers this question by making decisions about what properties and actions she considers as expressive of herself (90f.). The resulting sense of identity is subjective in the specifically modern sense in which individuals have a “right of subjectivity”, as Hegel calls it (88): a right to pursue a “will to be oneself” and to take over responsibility for what one is (90). Drawing on Charles Taylor’s work, Descombes interprets the corresponding condition of modern individualism as one of a “great disembedding”, where individuals have learned to treat facts about their origin and social ties as devoid of intrinsic normative force (107). Therefore, modern individuals face the dual task of (a) learning to see themselves as disembedded in the first place (through imaginative exercises of the kind “who would I have been if . . . ?”: 111), and (b) responding to the consequential “identity crisis” by “constructing” an identity of their own (104).

On one possible understanding, the “work on oneself” (104) that a modern individual has to carry out to shape his identity consists in a radical, existential choice. Through an illuminating reading of Hamlet’s famous question, Descombes objects to this view that in order to be in a position to make such a radical choice, the person needs to abstract away from everything that might enable her to decide for reasons of her own (100). Instead, Descombes argues that no deliberate choice in identity matters can fully abstract away from one’s “genealogical identity” (123), or one’s “human origins” (131). For counterfactual reasoning about who else one could have been needs to keep one’s biological origin fixed: otherwise, the reasoning would fail to single out a determinate subject for the relevant possibilities (111ff.).

It is not clear, however, where this claim leaves us with the question of how modern individuals shape their identity. One way of understanding Descombes’ alternative is that even in the framework of modern individualism, subjects will be able to live in a way that they find expressive of themselves ultimately only if they choose this way of living on the basis of reasons that derive from their origins (cf. 131, 199). But this would have the paradoxical implication that individual authenticity is possible only on the condition of conformity with the norms and expectations of the group(s) into which one happens to be born1. If, on the other hand, Descombes’ claim is merely that facts about one’s origin play a semantic (reference-fixing) role in one’s deliberation, it is unclear how the modern disembedded individual could avoid the situation of radical choice.

Chapters 5 and 6 finally turn to identity in the context of groups, or the question “who are we?”. In chapter 5, Descombes contrasts the specifically modern notion of a collective identity with its traditional forerunners (such as Aristotle’s conception of the polis and the medieval notion of a “moral person”) by linking collective identity in the modern sense to the concept of a nation, as understood by the sociologists Marcel Mauss and Louis Dumont. Instead of clarifying his motivations for this focus on nations — football clubs, political parties and federated regions, to name but a few, may be equally said to have (or acquire, or lose) an identity — , Descombes is more interested in putting Mauss’ view of the modern nation as a “collective individual” to a polemical use. On its basis, he criticizes the idea of supra-national political unities like the European Union (169) or a world state (170), claiming that attempts at constructing such entities necessarily lead to the “destruction of what constituted the individuality of the small countries, eclipsed within a more expansive political entity” (169). It is unfortunate that Descombes puts forward such a sweeping political claim without argument, and without sufficiently elucidating the notion of “collective individuality” that it builds on.

Chapter 6 moves on to the intriguing question of how the pronoun “we” is used in the context of a social contract or a constitution. Drawing both on Rousseau and on a distinction that the philosopher and social theorist Cornelius Castoriadis makes between a constituent and an instituting power (191), Descombes argues that the adoption of a constitution presupposes the existence of a society with a cultural identity (193f.) that serves as reference of the pronoun “we” within the constitutional text (192). In its turn, the fact that an individual is born into an existing cultural and political community enables him to shape his individual identity by adopting, carrying on and modifying the traditions of the community (199).

There are several worries with Descombes’ argument in this chapter. First, even if one grants that the act in which a constitution is adopted presupposes an existing society, it does not follow that this pre-constitutional society needs to have one shared cultural identity (as Descombes seems to assume, e.g. 191). Second, it is not clear why the constitution would have to continue to rest on the cultural preconditions of its creation once it has been established (as Descombes has to assume if he rejects, as he seems to, Habermas’ “constitutional patriotism”, 182). Rather, the members of an existing society who use “we” in order to adopt a constitution for themselves, and thus to create a political community, are free to stipulate in their constitution completely novel criteria for the acceptance of future members in their political community.

Finally, Descombes once more links his discussion in this chapter to a critique of political debates. In this case, he targets demands for a recognition of otherness, and pleas for a multicultural society. With regard to the former, Descombes attacks the view that democratic equality entails a right of others to be recognized “in their otherness” (183). He argues that this demand for recognition can either call for a treatment that is equal to that of others; but in this case, the difference in question is seen as normatively insignificant, and hence as “negligible” (185): “The difference that sets someone apart must in some sense be canceled out or at least reduced to insignificance and judged to be of no value” (183). Or it is demanded that this difference be attributed a value of its own (e.g., by assigning it a position in public space, school textbooks etc.: 185), but then the recognition needs to involve a hierarchical ranking of the other as being higher or lower in value than oneself (184), and hence contradicts democratic equality. This argument has an obvious flaw: equal treatment does not necessarily mean treating a difference as negligible or insignificant. If, for instance, a minority asks for equal treatment in a situation where only a majority culture is publicly represented, the minority may demand a change in public representation that takes into account its otherness and makes both cultures publicly visible, thereby treating them equally. In such situations, it makes perfect sense to insist on one’s otherness in order to obtain an equal treatment.

In discussing the idea of a multicultural society, Descombes restricts this notion rather artificially to a situation in which “Several cultural traditions contend for the allegiance of a single individual” (186). He points out that in order to be able to resolve conflicts between them, the individual has to adopt a ranking between the traditions (187), and argues that such a ranking would have to take the form of a “distinctive opposition”, where a sub-group within an overarching group defines itself by opposing itself to the rest of the overarching group. It would then depend on the context whether the individual’s action is determined by her membership in the overarching group or her membership in the sub-group (189). Once again, Descombes thinks that this option is in conflict with the nature of the modern nation as a collective individual: as such, the nation is “indivisible”, and “requires of us a complete loyalty rather than a loyalty that depends on context” (190). Yet this simply overlooks that advocates of a multicultural society do not want to replace the norms of the state with those of multiple cultural traditions. Taken on its own, legality in a democratic state leaves open infinitely many options for individual actions, values and worldviews2, and when it comes to choosing among them, there is no reason why one and the same individual could not draw on different cultural traditions. Nor does the individual need one clear-cut principle that ranks those traditions. It seems much more realistic that individuals administer conflicts among the demands of different traditions and groups (within the framework of legality) either through numerous specific, context-sensitive ranking principles, or on a case-to-case basis.

In addition, a more general motivation for Descombes’ critique of pluralistic discourses comes from his attempt to understand the notions of identity in question on the basis of his elementary notion. As a thing has precisely one identity (in the elementary sense) that distinguishes it from other things and is responsible for its persistence over time, Descombes finds the notion of a plurality of identities (or, for that matter, of a composite identity) of an individual problematic (33f.). But since the non-elementary notions of identity as Descombes understands them are not straightforward applications or extensions of his elementary notion anyway, this argument is not compelling. In addition, alternative accounts of non-elementary identity are available which are very well able to make sense of the pluralistic debates — for instance, Christine Korsgaard’s account of “practical identities” as self-conceptions or descriptions under which one values oneself, and which serve as sources of reasons for one’s actions3. One is therefore left wondering on what basis Descombes prefers his own reconstruction of non-elementary notions of identity over others.

The book left this reader with mixed feelings. Descombes’ complaint that the notion of identity is used in all kinds of contexts without sufficient awareness of the meaning and motivation of this usage is certainly well taken. And there is something very refreshing about this book: it brings together important topics that are normally debated in isolation from each other, and it draws its inspiration from a rich and unusual blend of sources, ranging from Aristotle to Hegel, from Epicharmus to Shakespeare and Molière, and from Pascal and Voltaire to Mauss and Castoriadis. Texts by these and other authors are discussed with great care and insight. Yet at the same time, Descombes only rarely includes among his interlocutors authors who have published in the last 25 years or so. This makes him sidestep a large amount of philosophical work that directly bears on his topics — including Korsgaard’s account of practical identities (1996, 2009), but also work on self-constitution (e.g., Frankfurt 2006; Korsgaard 2009), collective intentionality, social ontology4 and much else. Moreover, the author too often fails to make clear what exactly his claims and arguments are and how the different parts of the book are meant to connect with each other, and when he addresses political debates, he seems to be carried away by his polemical interests. This is particularly deplorable where Descombes makes harsh judgments about the coherence of anti-nationalist and anti-chauvinist projects and debates, while failing to give adequate characterizations of the targets of his critique and to supply satisfactory arguments for it. Given the public importance and the political sensitivity of such topics, one should expect philosophers to use particular care and rigor when dealing with them.


Frankfurt, Harry. 2006. Taking Ourselves Seriously and Getting It Right. Edited by Debra Satz. With Comments by Christine M. Korsgaard, Michael E. Bratman and Meir Dan-Cohen, Stanford: Stanford University Press.

Geach, Peter. 1962. Reference and Generality: An Examination of Some Medieval and Modern Theories. Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press.

Korsgaard, Christine. 1996. The Sources of Normativity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Korsgaard, Christine. 2009. Self-Constitution: Agency, Identity, and Integrity. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Rawls, John. 1993. Political Liberalism. New York: Columbia University Press.

Tuomela, Raimo. 2007. The Philosophy of Sociality: The Shared Point of View, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Wiggins, David. 2001. Sameness and Substance Renewed. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

1 Special cases apart where someone’s genealogy might give her reasons to break with the norms of the social environment into which she is born.

2 Cf. Rawls’ classical account of “reasonable pluralism” in Rawls 1993 (which one could have expected Descombes to discuss in this context).

3 Korsgaard 1996, 101. Cf. ibid.: “for the average person there will be a jumble of such conceptions.”

4 E.g. Tuomela 2007, whose notion of a “group ethos” is meant to capture one notion of collective identity: cf. ibid., 16.