Pyrrhonian Skepticism

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Walter Sinnott-Armstrong (ed.), Pyrrhonian Skepticism, Oxford University Press, 2004, 248pp, $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 0195169727.

Reviewed by Juan Comesaña, University of Wisconsin, Madison


This book is a collection of essays on Pyrrhonian skepticism. In particular, most of the papers deal with Robert Fogelin's neo-Pyrrhonism, as that position is laid out and defended in Pyrrhonian Reflections on Knowledge and Justification (Oxford University Press, 1994). But the book should be of interest not only to those wishing to pursue Fogelinian exegesis, but also to everyone interested in epistemology and the role that Pyrrhonian skepticism plays (and should play) in epistemological theorizing. The book is divided in two parts: five essays on the history of Pyrrhonian skepticism, from the Ancients to Wittgenstein, and six essays that deal with some of the philosophical problems related to Pyrrhonian skepticism.

What is Pyrrhonian skepticism? This question is at least in the background of many of the papers in this collection, and it is by no means clear that all the authors agree about its answer. But we can start by saying that the implied contrast is with cartesian (or Academic) skepticism. Cartesian skeptics think that we do not know most of the propositions that we ordinarily take ourselves to know -- and, thus, cartesian skeptics think that we should suspend judgment about those propositions. Pyrrhonian skeptics, on the other hand, go one step beyond cartesian skeptics (or, depending on your perspective, stop one step short), and think that we should suspend judgment also with respect to epistemic claims -- with respect to whether we do or do not know what we ordinarily take ourselves to know. Thus, in one sense Pyrrhonian skepticism is more radical than cartesian skepticism (it entails that we should suspend judgment with respect to more claims), and in another it is more moderate (it does not entail that we do not know what we ordinarily take ourselves to know).

What makes Pyrrhonian skepticism philosophically interesting is the existence of an argument for it. Before presenting one version of the argument, let me briefly acknowledge (if not address) two worries. First, there are interesting questions regarding the dialectical propriety of advancing an argument whose conclusion entails that belief in the premises is not justified. Second, and relatedly, the Pyrrhonian skeptic, under some interpretations at least, would not accept the conclusion of the argument: that would amount to making a negative dogmatic commitment, the sort of mistake that the Pyrrhonian accused the Academic skeptics of making. These worries run deep, I think, and they are addressed to some extent in some of the papers. For the moment, suffice it to say that the Pyrrhonian need not believe the premises of the argument in order to embarrass those who do. The argument employs what following an ancient tradition are called the "modes of Agrippa," and it has a prominent place both in the history of epistemology and in contemporary discussions. One rough but serviceable presentation of the argument proceeds as follows. Let's say that a belief is inferentially justified if and only if it is justified (at least in part) in virtue of its relations to other beliefs. A justified basic belief, by contrast, is a belief that is justified but not in virtue of its relations to other beliefs. An inferential chain is a set of beliefs such that every member of the set is allegedly related to at least one other member by the relation "is justified by." The Pyrrhonian argument can then be formulated thus:

1. If a belief is justified, then it is either a basic justified belief or an inferentially justified belief.

2. There are no basic justified beliefs.


3. If a belief is justified, then it is justified in virtue of belonging to an inferential chain.

4. All inferential chains are such that either (a) they contain an infinite number of beliefs; or (b) they contain circles; or (c) they contain beliefs that are not justified.

5. No belief is justified in virtue of belonging to an infinite inferential chain.

6. No belief is justified in virtue of belonging to a circular inferential chain.

7. No belief is justified in virtue of belonging to an inferential chain that contains unjustified beliefs.


8. There are no justified beliefs.

Premise 1 is beyond reproach, given our previous definitions. Premise 2 is justified by "the mode of hypothesis." Step 3 of the argument follows from premises 1 and 2. Premise 4 is also beyond reproach, if we accept premise 2 -- the only remaining possible structure for an inferential chain to have is to contain basic justified beliefs, but there are none of those according to premise 2. Premise 5 is justified by appeal to "the mode of infinite regression," and premise 6 is justified by appeal to "the mode of circularity." Premise 7 might seem to be a truism, but there are philosophers who would reject it (the Wittgenstein of On Certainty, on one interpretation of that fertile work, and, perhaps more clearly so, Ortega y Gassett in Ideas y Creencias).

I will focus my review on the papers in the second, non-historical part of the book. Let me, therefore, briefly summarize the papers in the first part. Even though we often talk, as I just did, of "cartesian" skepticism, Descartes himself, of course, was no Cartesian skeptic (thus the small 'c'). Janet Broughton's essay, "Cartesian Skeptics," investigates what kind of skepticism Descartes was battling, and argues that it wasn't what Fogelin calls cartesian skepticism. In "Historical Reflections on Classical Pyrrhonism and Neo-Pyrrhonism," Gisela Striker argues that, unlike the Neo-Pyrrhonism of Fogelin, ancient Pyrrhonists did not suspend judgment on epistemological grounds, but rather, they welcomed suspension of judgment as a side-effect of their inability to resolve the epistemological disputes: the relation between that inability and the suspension of judgment was for them, so to speak, merely causal, not rational. Ken Winkler's essay, "Berkeley, Pyrrhonism and the Theaetetus," deals with Berkeley's reaction to the skeptic mode of "relativity," and argues that this reaction brought him closer to the rationalist tradition than is commonly thought. In ''''A Small Tincture of Pyrrhonism": Skepticism and Naturalism in Hume's Science of Man," Don Garrett distinguishes, following Fogelin, several varieties of skepticism and places Hume in the resulting matrix -- arguing that Hume's naturalism and his skepticism are mutually supporting. Finally, in "Wittgenstein and Pyrrhonism" Hans Sluga argues that Wittgenstein was more of a Pyrrhonian skeptic than is usually thought, even in the Tractatus, and traces back the roots of this Pyrrhonism to Fritz Mauthner -- a Borgesian character who wrote "stories, critical reviews, a four-volume history of atheism, a dictionary of philosophy, a little book simply titled Language, an equally small book on Spinoza, in addition to the three hefty volumes of his Contributions to a Critique of Language" and was also a theater critic in Berlin "whose mere presence in the audience would almost guarantee the failure of the performance" (p. 104).

Many of the papers in the second part of the book address two related questions: Does Fogelin endorse Pyrrhonian skepticism?, and: Should he? Michael Williams, Walter Sinnott-Armstrong, Barry Stroud, and Roy Sorensen all think that the answer to the first question is not entirely clear. But whereas Williams, Stroud and Sorensen think that Fogelin shouldn't endorse skepticism, Sinnott-Armstrong thinks that there is a version of skepticism that should be endorsed.

In "The Agrippan Argument and Two Forms of Skepticism," Williams argues that skepticism can be defeated, but not by "the more familiar kinds of positive epistemological theory," but rather by a "more roundabout, diagnostic approach" (p. 122). The more familiar approach Williams calls the "direct" approach, and his preferred one, "diagnostic." The direct approach "takes the argument more or less at face value, accepting the skeptic's options while trying to put a better face on one of them" (p. 124); William's diagnostic approach, on the other hand, "aims to dispel the skeptical argument's air of intuitiveness," by attempting to show that it rests on "unacknowledged and problematic theoretical preconceptions" (p. 125). Williams has been arguing that we need to make this distinction between direct and diagnostic approaches to the skeptical problem for a while, but the distinction itself is, on its face, puzzling. As I have presented it, the Pyrrhonian argument is valid. As we tell our students, there are only two rational options to take when faced with a valid argument: accept the conclusion or reject one of the premises. One can, of course, just refuse to face the argument in question (an approach that I find is favored by many students), but, once faced, those seem to be the only rational options. When applied to the Pyrrhonian argument, this gives us a nice classification of epistemological theories: skeptics, of course, accept the conclusion of the argument, foundationalists reject premise 2, infinitists premise 5, coherentists premise 6, and 'positists' (the apt term is Jim van Cleve's) premise 7.

Such is the way of the direct approach. Williams's diagnostic approach promises a third option, which consists neither in accepting the conclusion nor in rejecting one of the premises, but rather in uncovering hidden presuppositions that reveal the theoretically laden nature of the skeptical argument. Very well, let us go along with Williams and grant him that the skeptical argument does have those hidden presuppositions -- in fact, let us grant him that the nature of those presuppositions is exactly as he thinks it is: they embody a "Prior Grounding Requirement" (roughly, every belief must be backed by explicitly held reasons). Now what? Once all the presuppositions are unhidden, once the theoretically laden nature of the skeptical argument is fully revealed, we still face the same two options as before: either accept the conclusion or reject one of the premises. Uncovering presuppositions might force one of those options, but it certainly doesn't magically open up a third one. Williams calls the approach to epistemology that arises from his diagnosis "contextualism" (not to be confused with the more common epistemic contextualism defended by Keith DeRose, Stewart Cohen and David Lewis among others). If I am right, then, Williams's contextualism has to be either a form of skepticism or one of the epistemological theories mentioned above. And indeed, Williams grants that "(f)ormally, contextualism looks like a variant of foundationalism" (p. 139). The difference, Williams thinks, is that contextualists don't have to claim that there is a single category of beliefs that form the foundation on which everything else must be based: "(t)here is no saying, outside of all particular contexts of inquiry or justification, what may be invoked in defense of what" (p. 139). Of course, there are different ways of being a foundationalist, but the point remains that, as Williams grants, the contextualist answer to the Pyrrhonian argument consists in denying premise 2. No third option has been uncovered by the diagnostic approach, and so the distinction between it and the direct approach remains a puzzling one.

In his contribution to the volume, "Contemporary Pyrrhonism," Barry Stroud attempts a similar third way. Stroud interprets the Pyrrhonian argument through the lens of his preoccupation with the project of "understanding human knowledge in general." What the skeptical argument shows, Stroud thinks, is that such a project is doomed, and that our various knowledge claims cannot be justified on the grounds that epistemologists think are available to us. Thus, Stroud is happy to be what he calls a "conditional skeptic": if we really do have available to us only those grounds that epistemologists think we have, then knowledge is impossible. But it appears that Stroud rejects the antecedent of that conditional: he says that once the Pyrrhonian has turned away from the epistemological enterprise, "he could often say that he knows such-and-such and be right in what he says (…)" (my emphasis, p. 176), and he puzzles over Fogelin's less than unwavering commitment to the truth of everyday knowledge attributions. But then Stroud is committed to denying the conclusion of the skeptical argument, which claims that we are not even justified in believing what we do--and so Stroud must think that one of the premises is false. As with Williams, I am puzzled by Stroud's attempts at finding a third way. It is always possible, of course, to just refuse to face the skeptical argument, but one is then not allowed to remark sotto voce: "Of course, the skeptical argument presupposes the Prior Grounding Requirement," or "Of course, much more is available to us to justify our beliefs than traditional epistemologists presuppose there is." If you don't want to say it, don't whistle it either.

Incidentally, it is of course possible to reject more than one of the premises in the skeptical argument. In "Two False Dichotomies: Foundationalism/Coherentism and Internalism/Externalism," Ernest Sosa, for instance, argues that whereas foundationalism and externalism might well be true of one kind of knowledge ("animal knowledge"), coherentism and internalism are plausibly true of a different kind ("reflective knowledge"), and in other recent work Sosa has made clear that he thinks that the distinction between those kinds of knowledge is one of degree.

In "Classy Skepticism," Walter Sinnott-Armstrong takes up an issue also discussed in Stroud's contribution: what to make of Fogelin's uneasy relation to everyday knowledge attributions. On the one hand, Fogelin thinks that Pyrrhonian skepticism leaves our "common beliefs of everyday life" untouched, including beliefs to the effect that I really know, for instance, that my name is Juan Comesaña. On the other hand, however, Fogelin insists that "in making knowledge claims, we always (or almost always) assert more than we have a right to assert" (Fogelin, Pyrrhonian Reflections on Knowledge and Justification, p. 94, cited by Sinnott-Armstrong, p. 189). Sinnott-Armstrong thinks that these apparently conflicting claims can be reconciled by appealing to a version of contrastivism.

The basic idea is that justification is not, appearances to the contrary, a binary relation between a subject and a proposition P, but rather a ternary relation between a subject, a proposition P, and a contrast class (which consists of propositions incompatible with P). It is not possible to assign a truth-value to the sentence "Mary is justified in believing that there is a zebra in front of her" without knowing what the contrast class is. Sinnott-Armstrong goes beyond this minimal expression of (formal) contrastivism and claims that different contrast classes will sometimes generate propositions with different truth-values. Thus, according to Sinnott-Armstrong, whereas in facing the zebra cage at the zoo Mary is justified in believing she is seeing a zebra rather than an antelope, she is not justified in thinking that she is seeing a zebra rather than a painted mule. Why does Sinnott-Armstrong think this? Because he adheres to the following conception of (contrastive) justification:

Someone, S, is justified in believing a proposition, P, out of a contrast class, C, when and only when S has grounds that rule out every other member of C but do not rule out P (p. 190).

and he thinks that Mary's experience rules out the proposition that she is seeing an antelope but not the proposition that she is seeing a painted mule.

Now consider three interesting contrast classes with respect to any proposition P: the unlimited contrast class, which comprises all the propositions contrary to P; the extreme contrast class, which comprises all the propositions contrary to P that could be eliminated, even if eliminating them is not needed in order to meet normal standards; and the everyday contrast class, which comprises those propositions contrary to P which we have to eliminate in order to meet normal standards. One way of understanding Fogelin's remarks regarding the propriety of both our everyday knowledge attributions and the Pyrrhonian skeptic's claim that we almost always assert more than we have a right to assert is to understand him as saying that nobody is justified in believing anything out of the extreme and unlimited contrast classes, although we usually are justified in believing things out of more restricted contrast classes.

I agree that going contrastivist (just like going contextualist) would give the Pyrrhonian a way of having his cake and eating it too, if all the Pyrrhonian wants is to be able to sometimes truly say that we are justified and sometimes truly say that we never are. But this is not all the Pyrrhonian wants. In addition, as Fogelin makes clear in his own contribution to the volume, "The Skeptics Are Coming! The Skeptics Are Coming!," it is vital that none of the Pyrrhonian pronouncements be philosophical. At least part of the motivation for this requirement is that if the Pyrrhonian were making philosophical pronouncements, then he would be committing himself to the truth of some claim, whereas making non-philosophical claims doesn't have similarly dire consequences. I confess that I don't see why this is so, but it is the basis for Fogelin's distinction between urbane and rustic Pyrrhonism. In Sinnott-Armstrong's hands, the impact of the requirement that the claims not be philosophical is captured by a requirement that they not be normative. And Sinnott-Armstrong thinks that contrastivism can deliver the required result, because whereas to say that someone is justified (or not) out of the relevant contrast class is to say something normative (the relevant contrast class is the one containing the possibilities that should be eliminated), to say that someone is (or is not) justified out of this or that particular contrast class is to say nothing normative.

But this seems wrong. When Sinnott-Armstrong says that Mary is not justified in believing that she is seeing a zebra out of the contrast class consisting of the proposition that Mary is seeing a painted mule, he is saying that Mary doesn't have grounds that rule out the possibility that she is seeing a painted mule. I'm not sure whether this is true or not (Stroud argues that it isn't), but it certainly is normative. It is relevant here that Sinott-Armstrong doesn't think that the grounds have to be incompatible with a proposition in order to rule it out: "grounds can rule out a [possibility] without entailing that it is false. No deductive chauvinism here! " (p. 190). But then, in saying that Mary's grounds don't rule out the possibility that she is seeing a painted mule, Sinnott-Armstrong is saying that Mary's grounds are not good enough to rule out that possibility, as normative a claim as they come. (The normativity would still be there even if Sinnott-Armstrong did require incompatibility, by the way, but the objection is easier to make this way.)

Sorensen's characteristically amusing contribution, "Commercial Applications of Skepticism," contains two important insights. First, Sorensen notices something that contextualists, in particular, should pay close attention to: when having knowledge is bad (for instance, when the issue is whether you knew that you were saying something false), raising potential defeaters for your beliefs (be they global defeaters like evil demons or brains in vats or local ones like baby-switches in the hospital) doesn't have the wanted consequence of robbing you of knowledge. The reason, Sorensen thinks, is that "[o]ne can raise the standard of scrutiny for claiming that we possess a good thing. But when that good thing is ignorance raising the level of scrutiny increases how much knowledge we attribute to ourselves."

Sorensen's second important insight has to do with the question with which we started this review: what is Pyrrhonian skepticism? When introducing the argument for Pyrrhonian skepticism, I noticed the oddity of someone's advancing an argument for the conclusion that we are not justified in believing anything (not even the premises of that argument). I said then that one need not believe the premises of an argument in order to embarrass those who do. This is related to Stroud's conditional skepticism, which Fogelin also embraces: all the Pyrrhonian is committed to is the conditional claim that if the premises of the argument are true, then the conclusion is true as well. It is the traditional epistemologist that accepts the premises of the argument, not the Pyrrhonian. Oddly enough, in his own contribution to the volume Fogelin seems to imply that rejecting one of the premises of the argument amounts to being a Pyrrhonian skeptic, and this is why externalists and contextualists are not really opponents of Pyrrhonian skepticism: they are the skeptics that are coming. Be that as it may, Sorensen makes a disarmingly simple point that, apparently, needs to be made: conditional claims are claims, and thus conditional skepticism is not skepticism. If the Pyrrhonian wants to avoid commitment to any assertion (or even any philosophical assertion, for what is more philosophical than pointing out the flaws in philosophical theories?), then he should avoid commitment to conditional assertions as well.

Anyone interested in skepticism should read this book. I don't think that the most puzzling aspects of Pyrrhonian skepticism are forever resolved in this volume, but they are certainly interestingly highlighted, and what fun would it be anyway if they were resolved?