Qualia and Mental Causation in a Physical World: Themes from the Philosophy of Jaegwon Kim

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Terence Horgan, Marcelo Sabatés, and David Sosa (eds.), Qualia and Mental Causation in a Physical World: Themes from the Philosophy of Jaegwon Kim, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 271pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107077836.

Reviewed by Daniel Stoljar, Australian National University


If I am not very much mistaken, the take-home message from this new book of essays on Jaegwon Kim’s famous work in philosophy is mind is this:  Kim, who is neither an Australian nor a materialist, is in fact an Australian materialist. 

Or, rather, he is an Australian materialist of a certain kind, for there are two kinds of Australian materialist.  An Australian materialist of any kind is a materialist who offers a distinctive two-premise argument for the identity of certain mental properties, such as pain, with physical properties, such as c-fibers firing.  The first premise asserts, on the basis of the meaning of the words, that pain is the property, whatever it is, that causes, and is caused by, such and such.  The second premise asserts that, as a matter of fact, some physical property, e.g., c-fibers firing, is the property that causes, and is caused by, such and such. Hence, pain is c-fibers firing.

But this argument can be developed against the background of two very different views about properties, which makes a big difference to how it should be understood and developed; that is why there are two kinds of Australian materialist.  One kind, which I associate mainly with D.M. Armstrong, holds that the only properties and relations that exist are instantiated properties and relations, and the only instantiated properties and relations are physical properties and relations, i.e., those expressed by predicates of the physical sciences (see, e.g., Armstrong 1968).  It follows immediately that, if some mental property, such as pain, exists, it must be identical to some physical property.  Which physical property?  The Australian materialist of the Armstrong type answers this by advancing the argument above.

An obvious question for this sort of materialist is this.  Even if pain (i.e., c-fibers firing) is expressed by the physical sciences, aren’t there lots of properties that are not?  For example, the computer I am working on has the property of being owned by a university.  But being owned by a university is not (we may suppose) a property expressed by any physical theory.  The Australian materialist of the Armstrong type answers, roughly, that this is just talk—or, to put it more politely, this is a case in which predicate nominalism is true.  Yes there is a bit of language, the predicate ‘is owned by a university,’ and yes it applies to my computer (which is a composite whose parts all instantiate physical properties), but there is no property of being owned by a university.  The reason is that all properties are physical and this one, if it exists, is not.

The other kind of Australian materialist, which I associate mainly with David Lewis, agrees that pain is identical to c-fibers firing (or something like it) and offers the same two-premise argument for supposing so; indeed, this is what makes this view a kind of Australian materialism (see, e.g., Lewis 1999).   But the Lewisian holds that there is a vast number of instantiated properties in addition to those expressed by the physical sciences. Indeed, for almost any predicate at all in any possible language, understandable by humans or not, there is a property expressed by that predicate.  And if the predicate applies to something, the property in question will be instantiated.

An obvious question for this sort of materialist is this.  If being owned by a university is not expressed by a predicate of any physical science, and yet is instantiated, why is materialism not false?  The Australian materialist of the Lewis type answers that, properly understood, materialism is not the thesis that all instantiated properties are physical, but is rather the thesis that all instantiated properties are either physical or bear the right sort of relation to physical properties; in particular, every instantiated property is necessitated by, and a priori entailed by, physical properties.  (This answer I associate mainly with Frank Jackson (see, e.g., Jackson 1998), so instead of the ‘Lewis-type’ view, we might more properly speak of the ‘Lewis-Jackson-type’ view; but let me set this aside.)

Now when I say that the take-home message of this book is that Jaegwon Kim is an Australian materialist, I mean one of the Armstrong type, not the Lewis type.  Why say that?  The main reason is that doing so makes considerable sense of many of the issues that come up in these papers.  I will illustrate this by looking at various related themes.

First, non-reductive materialism.  A non-reductive materialist—or physicalist; I assume these are interchangeable—is a materialist who holds that non-physical properties exist and are instantiated.  For Armstrongians, this is self-contradictory; it is just code for ‘materialism that is not materialism.’  For Lewisians, by contrast, non-reductive materialism is perfectly possible; indeed it is their position.  (That Lewisians reject other things that may reasonably be called ‘non-reductive materialism’ should not confuse us.)

This point is relevant to many of the papers here but most particularly to those by Louise M. Antony and Lawrence Sklar, which top and tail the collection.  Antony objects that, while Kim has written a famous book called Mind in a Physical World (see Kim 1998), he should by rights have also written Life in a Physical World and Mountains in a Physical World.  Her basic point is that sciences like biology and geology are in the same boat as psychology: we should treat the predicates of all these sciences as expressing properties just as much as the predicates of physics.

I am sympathetic to what Antony says but I think Kim would be unmoved.   A materialist of any sort, reductive or not, must think there is some division between physical and other sciences.  The materialist of the Armstrongian type says that physical sciences are distinguished because their predicates express properties; for the rest, nominalism is true.  Hence, if ‘is a mountain’ is geological predicate, but not a predicate of any physical science, then, while it may apply to (e.g.) Kilimanjaro, it expresses no property that Kilimanjaro has.

Of course, there remains the huge issue of why physics or physical sciences should be treated differently from other sciences in the first place.  This is taken up in Sklar’s paper, whose discussion is otherwise unrelated to the philosophy of mind topics that dominate this book.  Sklar points out that a lot of the features we often interpret physics to have—e.g. being universal in its application—are not in fact features of the theories that are proposed by living, breathing physicists. If so, the distinction between physics and other sciences may well be much harder to draw than it appears.

Second, the exclusion argument.  This argument—to put it roughly but serviceably for present purposes—proceeds from two premises.  The first premise—the closure premise—is that for every physical event that has a cause, there are physical properties that are efficacious in the causation of that event.  (By ‘efficacious’ here I mean something like ‘sufficient in the circumstances for’.) The second premise—the exclusion premise—is that if some property F is efficacious in the causation of an event, then no property distinct from F is also efficacious in the causation of that event. These two premises form the basis of an argument against any view that entails that non-physical properties are efficacious in the causation of physical events. Materialists of the Armstrong type do not take themselves to lie in the target range of this argument; that is why Kim advances it.  But materialists of the Lewis type do lie in its range, since they may well say that there are causally efficacious properties not identical with any physical property. 

This point is relevant to a large number of essays here, including those by Antony, Fred Dretske, Jackson, Barry Loewer, and Sydney Shoemaker.   The papers by Dretske and Shoemaker mostly recapitulate points made in their books:  Explaining Behaviour in Dretske’s case (see Dretske 1988), Physical Realization in Shoemaker’s (see Shoemaker 2007).  Antony focuses on the so-called ‘generalization’ problem, according to which the exclusion argument applies in the case of geology and biology just as much as psychology.

Jackson argues that, while pain is c-fibres firing, when we speak and think about pain, it cannot be c-fibers firing we have in mind, since we may know nothing about that.  He concludes that there must be some distinct but related property we are talking about.  More generally, he says, we should distinguish two properties: c-fibers firing (i.e. pain) and a property that Jackson calls “being in pain.”  Jackson goes on to say that, while the exclusion argument may show that being in pain (his second property) is not efficacious in the causation of physical events, it remains possible to say that it causally explains those events. And this, he thinks, is both reasonable and sufficient in the circumstances.

I am sympathetic to Jackson here too but again I fear Kim would be unmoved. For Kim would say that Jackson’s second property does not explain anything, for the simple reason that it doesn’t exist. From his point of view, as indeed from Armstrong’s, the most Jackson’s discussion of our talk and thought about pain could show is that the word ‘pain’ means something different from the words  ‘c-fibers firing’.  But from this it does not follow, according to them, that what we have here are distinct properties. (Jackson of course would in turn be unmoved; “Concepts and meanings do not float free of properties”, he says (p.32-3))

Loewer responds to the exclusion argument by distinguishing two notions of causation:  the production notion, according to which causation is a physical relation of some sort—transfer of energy, for example—and the dependence notion, according to which it is a relation, or set of relations, of counterfactual dependence. (The distinction and terminology is due to Ned Hall; see Hall 2004.) In particular, Loewer makes two points. (a) If we operate with the production notion, we should agree with Kim that the exclusion premise above is true; indeed, Loewer thinks, it is “virtually analytic” (p.55). But (b) if we operate with the dependence notion, we should reject the premise as false.

I am not sure about (a).  If causation is transfer of energy, whether the exclusion premise applies to it is presumably an empirical question; analyticity is irrelevant. On (b), Kim would yet again be unmoved.  The reason is not so much that Kim has objections to the counterfactual theory of causation.  He does have such objections, but, as Loewer points out, a proponent of that theory also has responses.  The reason is rather that, on Kim’s Armstrongian view, what is true of pain is true of causation: if it exists, it must be identical to some physical property (or relation).  Hence, on this view, there is no choice but to accept the production notion at the expense of the dependence notion.

Third, second-order properties.  A second-order property is a property expressed by a predicate of the form ‘has some property that meets condition C’.  Kim presents a notorious argument about second-order properties in this passage: “M is . . . the property of having a property with such and such causal potentials, and it turns out that property P is exactly the property that fits the causal specification.  And this grounds the identification of M with P” (1998, 98-9). A natural way to summarize the reasoning is like this: 

(1)  M = the property of having some property with causal potential C.

(2)  P = the property with causal potential C.

(3)  Ergo, M = P.

This argument is discussed in the papers of Ned Block and Antony, and is relevant also to those by Jackson and Brian P. McLaughlin. Antony points out that being a knitting needle is plausibly the second-order property of having some property that “permits the transfer of yarn loops knitwise and purlwise” (p.13).  She goes on to say that if being a wooden cylinder of a particular sort is the property that does this, it would be a mistake to conclude that being a knitting needle just is being (that sort of) wooden cylinder, since that preludes the possibility of plastic knitting needles.   Block points out similarly that P might be a first-order property; if so, the argument has Kim concluding that first-order properties are second-order properties.

I agree with Antony and Block that the argument is fallacious.  But I don’t think they nail down what is wrong with it.  Antony (p. 13) says its failure has to do with substitution into opaque contexts, but it is very hard to detect any opacity here.  Block (p. 118) says that the argument looks bad at first but is much better if you factor in the suggestion, which Kim makes in a number of places, that ‘the property of having a property with causal potential C’ is a non-rigid designator.  But I don’t think the argument does look better, for two reasons. 

First, expressions of the form ‘the property of having F’ are very plausibly rigid designators. Suppose, for example,  ‘the property of having F’ in fact denotes the property of being square.  Then, if you say ‘Imagine a world in which nothing has the property of being F’, what you are asking us to imagine is a world in which nothing has the property of being square, that is, in which nothing is square.  This strongly suggests that the expression denotes, relative to all possible worlds, the property it in fact denotes; and this is just what it is to be a rigid designator.  Since what goes for ‘the property of having F’ goes too for ‘the property of having some property with causal potential C’, it is mistaken to say this last expression is non-rigid.

But in any case—and this is the second reason why things look no better if you factor in non-rigidity—even if this expression is non-rigid, the (1-3) argument is still unpersuasive.  After all, non-rigid designators still designate, and, on the face of it, this one designates a second-order property.

What then is the problem with the argument?  The simple answer is that the expressions on the right hand-side of the identity signs in (1) and (2), while they use some of the same words, are in fact completely different.  So it is mistaken to suppose that what we have here is an argument by the transitivity of identity.  It is as if someone argued from ‘Albert is the guy who has a friend who plays the cello’, and ‘Betty is the friend who plays the cello’ to ‘Albert is Betty’. 

Indeed, the more interesting question raised by this argument is not whether it is wrong, or what is wrong with it, but what is going on when Kim apparently advances it.  Once again, interpreting him here as an Australian materialist of the Armstrong-type is helpful.   For such a philosopher, the issue was never about the semantics of property designators in the first place; that is as irrelevant as the phonology of property designators.  The real issue is what existing property could people be referring to when they use expressions of this kind.  What Kim is saying in the passage, I believe, is that in the circumstances, when people use an expression like ‘M’, the only property they could be talking about is P.  It is for that reason that he concludes that M is P.

This point is brought out well in McLaughlin’s paper.  McLaughlin points out that for Kim there is a sharp division between properties and concepts (or predicates), and that, while there may be second-order concepts, “there are no second-order properties” (p.76). McLaughlin goes on to argue that, even if there were such properties, there is a further problem for what he calls the “role-functionalist”—roughly, the Australian materialist of the Lewis type.  The problem is that the relevant second-order properties cannot be efficacious in the causation of physical events since they are defined in terms of those events.  (McLaughlin’s argument here is closely related to Jackson’s, and presumably could be answered in the same way, viz., by drawing a distinction between causation and causal explanation.)

Finally, multiple realization.  Multiple realization can be understood in various ways, but in this context we may understand it as a radical thesis about possibility:  that it is possible that two creatures, A and B, can be in pain even though there is no intrinsic physical property that they share. What then is the intrinsic property of pain that they apparently have in common? 

Australian Materialists of the Lewis type have an answer to this question, namely, that A and B each instantiates the (second-order) property of having a property that plays the relevant role.  This property is intrinsic, or at any rate is intrinsic if the role is spelled out in the right way.  And, at least if physical properties are those explicitly expressed by physical sciences, it is not a physical property. As we have seen, however, Kim rejects this answer on the ground that there are no second-order properties.

Australian Materialists of the Armstrong type have more difficulty with the question.  They could say that A and B share an intrinsic disjunctive property (or a disjunction of intrinsic properties). They could say that A has the (indexed) property of being in pain in A, while B has the (indexed) property of being in pain in B.  They could also say that A and B share extrinsic or relational properties.  But none of these options speak to the feeling that if A and B are in pain there is something intrinsic they share.

All this is relevant to Block’s paper.  Block rejects the Lewisian answer, not because the second-order property doesn’t exist, but because having it does not explain the similarity between A and B.  (And he rejects the Armstrongian answer for similar reasons.) He then goes on to make two suggestions.  First, that a materialist should reject the radical thesis of multiple realization formulated above, and say instead that there must be some intrinsic physical property shared by A and B if both are in pain.  Second, that this option is invisible to proponents of what Block, following a common recent usage, calls “the Canberra Plan”—roughly, a style of philosophy that generalizes to other cases the two-part argument for supposing that pain is c-fibers firing set out above.

If I understand matters correctly, Block’s criticism of the Canberra Plan is similar to a one offered by Lewis of the Canberra Plan as applied to causation. Lewis says that the Canberra Plan neglects the question of what is in common among different instantiations of causation (see, e.g., Lewis 2004, 76).  This is interesting for at least two reasons.  First, Lewis is usually thought of, not least in Block’s paper, as a proponent of the Canberra Plan.  Second, at the end of his paper, Block attributes to Lewis (and Dennett) the view that functionalism is a general feature of science.  Block objects that this view is false. One might also object it is meaningless unless it is made clear what the relevant functional definitions are.  But, regardless of its truth or meaning, one might also wonder, in the light of Lewis’s own criticisms of the Canberra Plan, whether it is properly attributed to Lewis.

I have been suggesting that seeing Kim as an Australian materialist of the Armstrong type explains a lot in these papers.  But, as I noted at the beginning, Kim is neither an Australian nor a materialist—what then is going on?  Well, as regards the first part of this, I hope it is obvious that being an Australian materialist is like being a Belgian waffle.  It is a style of being or having materialism, and you can be or have materialism of that style, regardless of where you are from, which is irrelevant.

“That’s all very well”, you might say, “but you can’t be a materialist of any style without being a materialist, and Kim isn’t one of those; hence he can’t be an Australian materialist.”  True enough, Kim is not a materialist.  He is, rather,  “something near enough,” as he puts it.   In particular, he holds that Australian materialism is true except for one exception, viz., phenomenal properties or qualia.  What justifies the exception?  The answer may be brought out by looking again at multiple realization.  Like Block, Kim thinks that A and B above must instantiate some intrinsic property in common. Since that property is not identical with any physical property, and since non-reductive materialism is out of the question, materialism is false.

There are many things to say about this part of Kim’s position, and the reactions to it in this book.  Let me limit myself to three points.  First, I think it is misleading to call this “near enough” to materialism.  Standard dualism already holds that materialism is true of most of the world; it is simply not true of phenomenal properties.  So in this context the thing that is near enough to materialism is just standard dualism.

Second, even if Kim’s position is standard dualism, he retains much of the structure of Armstrongian materialism, and there seems to me to several searching questions for that view.  Perhaps the main one is what it says about language, predicates, concepts, etc.—notions to which it helps itself without much explanation.  Both Armstrong and Kim (see, e.g., Kim 1998; 30) like to say there are no ontological free lunches, which is fair enough. But there are no conceptual magic puddings either, and I rather fear this is where the Armstrong-type position is heading.

Finally, a key element of Kim’s shift away from materialism is the idea that phenomenal properties are intrinsic.  This is relevant to the papers by Christopher Hill, James Van Cleve and Michael Tye, all of whom discuss the idea that they are not intrinsic. Hill’s paper is a development of themes in his book Consciousness, which argues among other things that a certain sort of representationalism may be appealed to in the defence of materialism (see Hill 2009).  Van Cleve’s paper is a discussion of the notion of transparency as it occurs both in G.E. Moore and in such contemporary writers as Dretske and John Campbell.  Van Cleve argues persuasively that, for Moore, transparency entails that experiences have no intrinsic properties at all.  (Indeed at this point my comparison of Kim and Armstrong breaks down rather badly.  Armstrong himself was a fan of transparency and defended a representationalist view of perception, akin to that held by Hill and Tye.)

Tye’s paper is an attack on phenomenal internalism, which he understands as the thesis that, for any two things at all, it is metaphysically necessary that, if they are intrinsic duplicates, they are phenomenal duplicates.  Tye offers a counterexample in which a brain-like thing grows on a tree on a faraway planet.  Amazingly, for a short period, the brain-like thing has the same intrinsic properties as the brain of Lolita, a person living on Earth.  The brain-like thing and Lolita’s brain are intrinsic duplicates, Tye says, but are not phenomenal duplicates, since Lolita has experiences while the brain-like thing has none.

How persuasive is this?  One might agree it works against phenomenal internalism as Tye formulates it.  But consider the more restricted thesis that, for any two psychological subjects, it is metaphysically necessary that if they are intrinsic duplicates they are phenomenal duplicates.  This thesis too deserves the name ‘phenomenal internalism.’  But it is untouched by Tye’s counterexample, since, as he himself insists, the brain-like thing is not a psychological subject. (Tye does consider some alternative formulations of phenomenal internalism, but not this one, so far as I can see.)

This volume is intended, so the editors (p. ix) say, to be “a fitting tribute to Professor Kim’s body of work”.  It certainly is a fitting tribute, at least in the sense that the eleven essays it contains are individually of extremely high quality.  So the book is well worth having in one’s library.  A bit disappointing, however, is the fact that the editors make no attempt to explain the ways in which these papers improve on the already large literature on these topics, or to bring out the big themes in Kim’s philosophy that the papers are responsive to.  They make no attempt, as we might say, to bring out the one that runs through the many.  It is partly for this reason that I have read Kim here as an antipodean Armstrong.


Thanks to members of the ANU Philosophy of Mind Work In Progress Group, and to David Chalmers, for comments on a previous draft of this review.


Armstrong, D.M. 1968 A Materialist Theory of the Mind, Routledge.

Dretske, F 1988 Explaining Behaviour, MIT Press.

Hall, N. 2004 ‘Two Concepts of Causation,’ in John Collins, Ned Hall, and L.A. Paul (eds.), Causation and Counterfactuals, MIT Press, pp. 225-76.

Hill, C.  2009 Consciousness, Cambridge University Press.

Jackson, F. 1998 From Metaphysics to Ethics, Oxford University Press.

Kim, J. 1998 Mind in a Physical World: An Essay on the Mind-Body Problem and Mental Causation, MIT Press.

Lewis, D. 1999 Papers in Metaphysics and Epistemology, Cambridge University Press.

Lewis, D 2004 ‘Causation as Influence’ (longer version), in John Collins, Ned Hall, and L.A. Paul (eds.), Causation and Counterfactuals, MIT Press, pp. 75–106.

Shoemaker S. 2007 Physical Realization, Oxford University Press.