Quality of Life and Human Difference

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David Wasserman, Jerome Bickenbach, and Robert Wachbroit (eds.), Quality of Life and Human Difference, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 273pp, $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521832014.

Reviewed by Kevin McDonnell, Saint Mary's College


This book's goal is bringing together two discussions, one dealing with quality of life assessments from a health policy perspective and the other with the ethical issues surrounding allocation of resources and prenatal testing from the viewpoint of people with disabilities. Advocates for disabled people have protested that public policies based on quality of life assessments have a negative impact on the medical resources made available to handicapped people and that policies promoting prenatal testing foster attitudes of disrespect toward them. Getting leading participants in these conversations talking with each other has the potential to improve health care policy and public attitudes toward disabled people.

The book was compiled primarily from working papers prepared for a group the editors convened. The papers were then revised for publication in light of the discussions. The book is professionally presented: each essay is accompanied by an extensive bibliography and there is a cumulative index. The editors' Introduction lays out the historical background of both conversations and discusses their importance for social policy. It concludes with a brief summary of the nine chapters that follow. Anyone looking for the current state of either of the conversations this volume attempts to bring together will find the book a valuable resource.

This review will argue, however, that the editors have delivered a noble and instructive failure in their efforts to get participants in these conversations talking with each other. The failure follows from the incommensurability of the framing assumptions of the participants. For the purposes of this review, it is useful to think of the book as containing two anchor articles with commentary and critical pieces clustered around them.

The first anchor is Dan Brock's "Preventing Genetically Transmitted Disabilities while Respecting Persons with Disabilities." The effort of Brock's piece is to show that, contrary to the allegations of advocates for the disabled, there is an important moral difference between attempting to avoid the birth of seriously disabled children and giving positive weight to disability in prioritizing health care resources. His discussion proceeds by presenting a number of examples and developing principles that can embrace in a coherent theory the moral intuitions captured in them. Brock argues that our moral intuitions require two principles. The first deals with people who actually exist (the Person-Affecting Harm Prevention Principle) and enables us to justify providing such people with an ample and fair supply of health care resources. The second (the Non-Person-Affecting Harm Principle) captures the intuition that it is wrong knowingly to bring handicapped people into existence. Since the latter principle pertains to the lives of people who do not exist, there can be no issue of harm or discrimination against them. Brock admits that applying these principles does not offer a full solution to all the issues raised in the discussion, but, I would add, that is not for any lack of ingenuity or effort on his part.

It is not the details but the framework of his philosophical effort that, I believe, prevents Brock's entry into dialogue. One symptom of this blockage can be found in his references. There are nineteen works referred to, seven by Brock himself but only one by Adrienne Asch, the co-author of the volume's other anchor piece. Brock's project is encased in a long-term conceptual effort to produce ever more sophisticated covering-law moral principles, which principles are justified by their ability to unite our moral intuitions. Brock's essay has a "view from nowhere" air to it as captured by his use of impersonal constructions and the passive voice: "Parents would be considered irresponsible and negligent if …" and "It is commonly assumed that …" There are also a number of appeals to social consensus, as in "there is virtually universal consensus that …" and "I believe most people would agree …" These latter appeals may be more the view from the faculty lounge than the view from nowhere.

The other anchor article in the book, "Where is the Sin in Synecdoche?" by Adrienne Asch and David Wasserman, goes at the issues in a completely different way. These authors are not looking for principles that can embrace a multitude of moral intuitions, but are concerned to illuminate how we too often think of disabled people and to persuade readers to think differently.

Synecdoche is the rhetorical device in which a part is used to stand for the whole, as in "lend me your ears." The authors argue that, in thinking about the lives of disabled people, we too often pay disproportionate attention to the disabled part and allow it to stand for the whole person. While their essay centers on its critique of this particular synecdoche, they are also critical of the consumerist and perfectionist attitude toward handicapped people. These attitudes all drive the ready acceptance of prenatal testing to which these authors are opposed. But the radical critique of their article is directed at what the authors describe as "a morally impoverished conception of parenthood and family." (173)

Asch and Wasserman offer a demanding ideal of family. "Families begin with one or more adults 'pledging' to love, nurture, and protect a person they have never met -- a person to whom they will be bound not by compatible interests or tastes (though these may emerge), but by the profound dependency at the onset of that relationship, and by their resolve to sustain and nurture that person when he is at his most vulnerable." (202) The family, they argue, is not an exclusive club admitting only those who qualify for membership. And that moral status is threatened by prenatal testing which poses an "affront to an ideal of unconditioned devotion." (202)

Their writing in these passages is straightforwardly first person. In its appeal to the central goods of familial relationships, the argument has resonance with Alasdair MacIntyre's in Dependent Rational Animals. Their position is robustly ethical and without illusions as to its sociological validity as they readily grant that parental commitment may well be more honored in the breach. The authors recognize that incorporating such substantive ideals into public policy would, however, confront a serious challenge. Supportive though I also am of the ideal of commitment that Asch and Wasserman propose, it is difficult to see how it would pass through the needle's eye of public reason that the established political liberalism imposes.

Given this methodology, it is easy to see how difficult it is for Asch and Wasserman to engage in dialogue with philosophers like Brock. Their first-person prescriptions and Brock's impersonal descriptivism, their idealism and Brock's sociological realism, Brock's quest for covering-law principles and their advocacy of unconditional devotion -- all indicate that their discussion originates in incommensurable philosophical frameworks. Yet there is something of Brock's disquieting intellectual isolation in Asch and Wasserman's article. They cite forty-five sources, five by Asch, two by Wasserman, none by Brock.

My emphasis on two anchor articles is a device for organizing this review; it is not an evaluation of other contributions to this volume. The remaining pieces can be divided into the technical, the pluralist, and the skeptical.

Beginning with the technical, Jerome Bickenbach and Erik Nord are concerned with clarifying the history, meaning, and application of several proposed measures of health. Nord attempts to clarify what health state scores mean by proposing definitions for some key terms. I found it hard to get past his first definition: "I define the worth of a person as the value attached by society to the enhancement of the interests and opportunities of that person relative to the interests and opportunities of other persons." (126) Bickenbach presents the history of the World Health Organization's World Health Report, 2000 and its ranking of countries by health states. He reports the controversies both in methodology and data collection that challenge the Report's validity. Most importantly, and this can be read as a response to Nord, he challenges the neglect of justice which he believes flows from the Report's underlying utilitarianism. "Despite all the enthusiasm with which advocates of cost-effectiveness insist that all justice considerations can be factored in as side constraints to cost-effectiveness (Ubel, 2000), when justice conflicts with cost-effectiveness the fans of cost-effectiveness will never grant that justice, in Ronald Dworkin's original phrase, should trump." (258)

Although there are skeptical moments in each, I think Jeff McMahon and Tom Shakespeare are best thought of as pluralists. McMahon's article turns on what he considers to be the rationality of looking at the same situation from different evaluative perspectives. Even the same person, he observes, may have different perspectives at different times of life. While there may be some impersonal perspective from which parenting a disabled child is burdensome, parents who actually undertake doing so may rationally find their responsibilities rewarding. As he wryly concludes, "there are no prenatal tests for the features of my endowment that have been particularly burdensome to my parents." (169) Referring to the Asch and Wasserman versus Brock discussion, Tom Shakespeare argues, "I am not persuaded by either set of arguments… I do not believe there is a single rational solution to the moral quandary of whether to terminate a pregnancy affected by disability, nor should there be." (217) He places great stress on autonomy and fears that current practices for prenatal testing are heavily biased toward terminating pregnancies.

The three remaining authors can be characterized as skeptics. Robert Wachbroit observes that instruments for assessing quality of life are widely available to aid clinicians and patients facing difficult medical treatment choices. But the most useful of these are disease- and treatment-option specific. In health policy discussions, however, quality of life instruments attempt the far more challenging task of providing a common metric across a number of diseases or disabilities. Wachbroit doubts that such comparisons are possible. Ron Amundson argues that philosophical pretense to objectively measure disability has failed to come to grips with the intellectual challenges forged by the disability rights movement, particularly the charge that most disabilities are the result of social structures and attitudes, not the physical condition of the disabled person. Finally Anita Silvers rejects the attempt to conceptualize health as an asset or a commodity. "We presume that there will be a univocal standpoint from which we establish the instrumental value of material assets [i.e. money]. I cannot, however, likewise assess the value of your health assets because your health is a resource for you in ways that it can never be for me." (56)

This book is a fine example of the non-Euclidean axiom that the sum of the parts is more than the whole. It is a book of many excellent parts, but it does not come together as a whole project. And that is more a sad commentary on the fractured state of philosophy than on the editors' efforts.