Quantifier Variance and Realism: Essays in Metaontology

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Eli Hirsch, Quantifier Variance and Realism: Essays in Metaontology, Oxford University Press, 2011, 261pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199732111.

Reviewed by Matti Eklund, Cornell University


This collection by Eli Hirsch consists primarily of essays concerning the ontology of physical objects, and most of them have been written during the last ten years. In broadest outline, Hirsch defends a conception of ontology (a 'metaontology') according to which ontological questions are 'shallow', to use Hirsch's own term; and in ontology proper he defends a common sense view on what there is. The metaontological view and the ontological view are related. Hirsch's defense of common sense ontology proceeds via the metaontology. I will later discuss exactly what the connection is.

In the last few years, metaontology has become a going concern, and I think that is very much thanks to Hirsch's clear and challenging writings defending a particular metaontological perspective. It is definitely useful to have Hirsch's essays collected in this volume. While the essays undeniably overlap each other to a considerable extent, anyone interested in the topics brought up will find that they illuminate the underlying issues in different ways and that it is useful to have them collected.

Let me start by discussing two main metaontological ideas it appears one can find Hirsch defending in these essays: the doctrine of quantifier variance, and the idea that ontological disputes -- where Hirsch focuses on disputes in the ontology of physical objects -- are verbal. Before long we will see that Hirsch's real view is in important ways more subtle than the initial characterizations of these theses will suggest. But the simple theses will provide a useful starting point, and besides, Hirsch definitely says things that clearly suggest these theses, even if his real views are more complex.

The doctrine of quantifier variance, as one finds it in the earliest essays where Hirsch discusses it, is the view that "the world can be correctly described using a variety of concepts of 'the existence of something'" and that "different concepts of an 'object' might be employed in different conceptual schemes, schemes that are all adequate for describing the world" (pp. 68, 139; in both places there are prominent references to Hilary Putnam as a friend of the view). Using one concept of existence one can truly say "tables exist"; using another one can truly say "tables don't exist", etc. An integral part of this doctrine as presented is that no concept of existence is metaphysically privileged (p. 84). Call the idea of quantifier variance as just introduced QV.

When talking about verbal disputes, Hirsch says, "I claim that the dispute between endurantists and perdurantists is verbal" (p. 229), where a verbal dispute is one where "each party ought to agree that the other party speaks the truth in its own language" (ibid.). (There are many uses of the labels 'endurantism' and 'perdurantism' in the literature. On the way Hirsch uses these labels, the views differ primarily over what there is: the perdurantist believes in a strictly richer ontology as she believes in temporal parts and arbitrary sums thereof.) Call the claim about verbal disputes VD. A main idea behind VD is that the principle of charity governs correct interpretation, and charity is especially important when it comes to certain classes of utterances, such as perceptual reports and utterances that concern what is regarded as a priori and necessary.

Partly in order further to illustrate QV and VD, let me state some immediate objections that can be raised. My aim here is not to press these objections, but rather to bring them up for illustrative purposes. Whatever in the end the fate of the objections, they are relevant and prima facie reasonable objections to QV and VD as presented.

In the case of QV, one worry concerns what it even means to say that there are different concepts of existence. Surely not simply that 'there is', 'exists', etc. might mean different things in different languages: for one thing that is trivial; for another, the possibility that 'there is' in some language means is green doesn't promise to shed much light on the nature of ontological disputes. And not that 'there is' while meaning what it actually means in English expresses different concepts of existence: for what might that even mean? (One thing it could mean is that 'there is' is, e.g., polysemous or context-sensitive. But Hirsch makes clear that this is not supposed to be entailed by the claim (p. 80), even though he occasionally stresses that his views allow for 'there is' to be indeterminate: see especially the essay "The Vagueness of Identity".) But what else can be meant? One suggestion is that the idea is that 'there is' could express different things while still having a suitably quantifier-like meaning -- where, throughout, I will use 'quantifier' to speak of unrestricted existential quantifiers.[1] But what is it for an expression to have a quantifier-like meaning? Hirsch gestures at sameness of "syntactic and formal logical properties" (p. 71). But that just invites a new problem: as has been prominently discussed, if two expressions in different languages both satisfy the classical introduction and elimination rules for the existential quantifier, then they are logically equivalent (see, e.g., Williamson (1987-88)), while surely the idea behind QV must be that the different possible quantifiers are inequivalent.

An orthogonal kind of complication concerning QV is that given that the quantifiers are supposed to obey the classical inference rules, the supposed differences in meaning between the quantifiers of the different languages entail differences in what some names and predicates mean. If two languages differ concerning the truth-value of "∃xF(x)" they will differ also concerning the truth-value of "F(a)", where, intuitively, 'a' is a name that refers to an 'F' if there are 'Fs'. But then given that there are such widespread differences between the languages, it becomes a delicate issue just what the relation between the quantifiers is: the quantifiers do not differ simply in that "there are" Fs in the sense of the "there are" of one of the languages but not the other, for 'F' too differs in meaning between the languages. Call this phenomenon one of seeping through: differences in quantifier expressions seep through to other types of expressions. I will return to this later.

When it comes to VD there is an immediate problem that has been oddly overlooked in the literature. (But see my (ms) and Balaguer (ms) for some discussion.) While it is reasonably clear what it is for a self-described endurantist and a self-described perdurantist, say Peter van Inwagen and Ted Sider, to have a merely verbal dispute -- they do if they each ought to agree that the other speaks the truth in his language -- what exactly does it mean for "the" dispute between endurantists and perdurantists to be verbal? One straightforward thing this could mean is that all actual self-described endurantists ought to agree that all self-described perdurantists speak the truth in their language, and vice versa. But even this claim, even if it should be true and even if it surely is a bold claim in its own right, would not suffice for a principled critique of "the question of whether endurantism or perdurantism is true", or for the general charge that this question is shallow. For it is compatible with it being possible to formulate significantly a question over which thesis is true. What might suffice for a principled critique is the claim that if the sentences that express, say, perdurantism are true in my language then there is absolutely no way that I ought to interpret anyone as asserting the endurantist doctrine, as opposed to merely uttering sentences that in my language would express that doctrine. But such a general claim, once distinguished from the weaker claims in the vicinity, is arguably too strong to be believable.

It is clear that Hirsch thinks that in interpretation we should give special respect to utterances that communities regard as expressing something a priori and necessary, and that this is why the conciliatory interpretations are correct in the cases he discusses, for the philosophical disputants differ over sentences they each regard as a priori and necessary. But why should we give such special weight to such utterances? Here is an immediate speculation. It is a commonplace that charity in interpretation involves not taking the interpretee to reject what one finds obvious. Presumably Hirsch thinks special status should be accorded to the supposed truths regarded as a priori and necessary because those truths are obvious. And the most prominent kind of view on which a priori necessary truths have this kind of privileged epistemological status is one on which these truths are analytic. It is natural to conjecture that this is Hirsch's view. The conjecture receives support from Hirsch's sometimes speaking of the truths as "a priori conceptual" (pp. 99, 182). One question for Hirsch is whether he is indeed thinking of the truths as analytic, and, if so, what role that assumption plays for him. The closest he comes to addressing the matter is where, in response to concerns raised in John Hawthorne (2009), he states, without argument, that his case would go through even if the endurantist/perdurantist dispute were partly empirical (p. 222).

It should be clear from the brief characterizations above of QV and VD, and from the discussion of what objections may be raised against these theses, that they are logically independent. A friend of QV as described can insist that ontologists don't speak past each other along the lines of VD. A friend of VD, emphasizing that ontologists who appear to speak the same language are in fact speaking different languages, can hold, as against QV, that one language is metaphysically privileged over the others by virtue of containing a metaphysically privileged quantifier. Some of the literature that discusses Hirsch focuses on VD and other literature focuses on QV. (For discussion of the idea that ontological disputes are merely verbal, see, e.g., Karen Bennett (2009), Cian Dorr (2005), John Hawthorne (2009), Kathrin Koslicki (2005), Matthew McGrath (2008), Ted Sider (2009). For discussion dealing with the idea of quantifier variance, see, e.g., David Chalmers (2009), Matti Eklund (2007, 2009), John Hawthorne (2006), Ted Sider (2007, 2009).)

In several places (pp. xiii-xiv, 73f, 187ff), Hirsch is concerned to make clear that he is not committing himself to any kind of idealism or antirealism. It is possible that his cautionary remarks about this are needed -- that some people may take him to be committed to that type of view. But the philosophical mistake in so interpreting Hirsch is rather crude. From the fact that "chips" means one thing in American English and another in British English, it does not follow that there is no language-independent fact as to what chips are. Correspondingly for "there is" and the possible languages Hirsch discusses.

Another possible confusion regarding Hirsch's view stems from the fact that there is a temptation to think of the languages Hirsch speaks of as ___ist languages, for the various -isms discussed, and to think of some languages as more ontologically permissive than others. This is convenient shorthand (and I will myself use such shorthand below) but it suggests that one set of propositions comes out true in one language and another set of propositions comes out true in another language, and hence that propositional truth is somehow relative to language. Such a view would be rather strange. The view we are actually concerned with is rather that there are possible languages where utterances of theorists we would naively regard as holding different ontological views come out true under the assumption that these are the languages they speak, but the reason these utterances come out true in these languages is that they there express different propositions from those they express in our language.

So far I have been concerned with QV and VD. But as already indicated, Hirsch's real views are somewhat more subtle and complex, even if there are passages where he seems explicitly to commit himself to QV or VD as stated.

When it comes to QV, the following should first be noted. Already in one of the earlier essays, Hirsch is fairly casual concerning whether we are really dealing with different concepts of existence, and he expresses willingness to describe the alternative languages considered as not containing an expression expressing any concept of existence (p. 71; the point is emphasized also in the introduction, p. xiv). With this qualification in place, questions about what it is for a possible meaning to be quantifier-like are moot. What we get is a different kind of variance thesis -- call it generalized variance (GV) -- which simply says that there is no metaphysically privileged language for describing the world. A language within which our concept of existence is expressed can be such that the world can be fully and correctly described in it, but so can a language within which another concept of existence is expressed or which cannot express any concept of existence at all.

Second, while in some essays Hirsch outright dismisses, it seems quite centrally, the idea of a "metaphysically privileged quantifier" (pp. 84, 143), other essays give a somewhat different impression. He discusses Sider's idea of "logical joints" -- that some possible logical expressions, including some unrestricted existential quantifier, carve at nature's joints -- and while he dismisses the idea as mysterious, his main point is that even if there are logical joints, and even if meanings that carve at the joints are reference-magnets, more eligible to be meant than other meanings, charity can and often does trump reference-magnetism, so his argument is not really threatened (pp. 122, 130). To elaborate: it is possible to think that if there is a quantifier meaning that is a reference magnet, its magnetism trumps charity, and the ontological debates are not verbal after all, contra VD. While this is a concern Hirsch takes seriously, his response is to say that even if there is a reference-magnetic metaphysically privileged quantifier, this does not in fact affect what he is really concerned with. Since the truth of the variance thesis of course does turn on what if anything is metaphysically privileged, even while VD and theses in that ballpark do not, it then seems Hirsch is really more concerned with the latter sort of thesis. (A reaction different from Hirsch's would be that if indeed there is a metaphysically privileged quantifier, it is of greater philosophical significance to ask what 'there is' means in the sense of that quantifier than what 'there is' means in its ordinary sense.)

Here is one hypothesis regarding what is going on. When first writing about these issues, Hirsch was influenced by Putnam, as evidenced by central references to Putnam's work, and QV -- or GV -- was a genuine concern; but more recently Hirsch's focus has shifted to something like what I have called VD -- it is also that latter sort of thesis that is the topic in the latter essays in this collection, such as "Physical-Object Ontology, Verbal Disputes, and Common Sense" and "Ontology and Alternative Languages". In the latter article Hirsch moreover characterizes quantifier variance in a way that better fits my characterization of VD, and there is no mention of metaphysical privilege (p. 220). However, the Introduction to the collection, the most up-to-date statement of Hirsch's views, again complicates the picture. Quantifier variance is there explained as follows:

The doctrine of quantifier variance might be viewed as simply a corollary of Urmson's dictum. When two philosophers X and Y are engaged in an ontological dispute it will often … happen that we can conceive of two possible languages, the X-language and the Y-language, such that these languages are truth-conditionally equivalent and, in any context of utterance, [a] speaker of the X-language can both reasonably and truthfully assert the same (phonetically individuated) sentences … that the X-philosophers assert, whereas [a] speaker of the Y-language can both reasonably and truthfully assert the same sentences that the Y-philosophers assert … The meanings of such quantifier expressions as "there exists something"… vary from language to language. Urmson's dictum implies that truth-conditionally equivalent ontological languages are of equal metaphysical merit. That is the doctrine of quantifier variance. The doctrine says that there is no uniquely best ontological language with which to describe the world. (p. xii)

Hirsch here starts by describing "quantifier variance" pretty much as VD, only to add the bit about there not being metaphysical privilege. It would have been useful if Hirsch had more clearly separated the different theses he wants to defend. (In the above passage, "Urmson's dictum" is to the effect that if two sentences are "equivalent" then "it is not the case that one will be nearer to reality than the other" (Urmson 1956, p. 186, quoted in the Introduction, p. xi). As stated, the dictum only says that if the content is the same then there is no difference in metaphysical goodness between the sentences. Hirsch adds to this an understanding of the equivalence in question according to which two sentences are equivalent in the relevant sense already if they are true with respect to the same possible worlds (Introduction, p. xi).)

There are also important qualifications when it comes to Hirsch's stance with respect to VD. First, explicitly skirting difficulties having to do with (Burgean) social externalism (see, e.g., p. 146), Hirsch considers, when running his argument, imagined communities which are uniform in the sense that in one everyone is happy to utter the sort of thing that the endurantist is happy to utter, in another everyone is happy to utter the sort of thing the perdurantist is happy to utter, etc. When we take this into account, the VD-style claim Hirsch makes is not that the endurantist and the perdurantist have a verbal dispute in the sense characterized but rather the disjunctive claim that either they have a verbal dispute in that sense or, if they do not, that is for reasons having to do with social externalism. It is only if we allow that a dispute can be verbal even if the words used mean the same things in the disputants' mouths that Hirsch's view can be described as one on which the ontological disputes in question are verbal. Second, more significantly, in a number of different places Hirsch makes clear that his claim that the dispute is verbal is supposed to apply when the dispute remains at the "all is said and done"-stage (pp. 159, 230). That is to say, the claim is that if a dispute between a (self-described) endurantist and a (self-described) perdurantist remains at the "all is said and done"-stage, then it is verbal. One reason we may find the qualification significant is that it can be doubted that the debates actually prosecuted really would remain at the "all is said and done"-stage. Even if the debates seem intractable and do not seem to be resolved any time soon, certainly not all is said and done. This doubt notwithstanding, it is of course a significant question whether an ontological debate that would persist even at the "all is said and done"-stage is thereby verbal. David Lewis (1983), to whom Hirsch refers for having called attention to the "all is said and done"-stage, denies this; Hirsch affirms it.

Second, it also deserves emphasizing that there is an important argument that Hirsch puts forward in connection with the discussion of the claim that ontological disputes are verbal but which seems separable from any such claim. Let Shmenglish be a language much like English except for the possible difference that in Shmenglish the common sense ontology sentences are true: "there are tables", "there is nothing composed of my nose and the Eiffel tower", … If Shmenglish=English then the common sense ontologist is right. Consider then the following argument: (1) There is such a possible language as Shmenglish. (2) If there is such a possible language as Shmenglish, constraints on proper interpretation such as the principle of charity yields that Shmenglish=English. (3) So, Shmenglish=English. (See pp. 91-3, 110-2, 125, 164-9.) It is natural to conjoin this argument with the claim that for other, non-commonsensical ontological positions there are possible languages wherein utterances made by those who defend those positions would come out true. And it may further be that (bracketing social externalism) philosophers who defend such positions -- or at least sound like they do -- really speak such languages while ordinary English-speakers speak Shmenglish. If so, then ontological disputes are verbal. But whatever the fate of those claims, they are separable from the just stated argument for common sense ontology.

Hirsch's argument for common sense ontology is somewhat similar in spirit to 'Moorean' arguments -- think here of the Moorean point that common sense beliefs are better justified than the premises of any skeptical argument against them -- rather generally. But rejecting skepticism about knowledge due to Moorean considerations is often accompanied by more detailed investigation of what it is about knowledge that allows us to have it despite the skeptical challenge. Saying that the skeptic must be wrong is only the beginning. The task of properly explaining exactly how the skeptic goes wrong still remains. By contrast, Hirsch appears content to argue that the deviant ontologist is mistaken -- maybe in part because there are more deviant ontologists around than there are genuine epistemological skeptics. He does not devote much attention to the question of, so to speak, what it is about ordinary objects that allows them to exist despite the deviant ontologist's challenges. He does say that in interpretation we should generally attach more weight to particular judgments than to general principles such as that no two objects can be in the same place at the same time, but that is about it. Another philosopher might be interested in going on: even given that such general principles are false, what is it about objects that allows them to coincide?

In some of his essays, Hirsch refers to Carnap as a precursor (e.g., pp. 144, 220). I have elsewhere given voice to doubts concerning the understanding of Carnap's position, by no means specific to Hirsch, that such claims presuppose. (See Eklund (forthcoming).) Even if I should be wrong about that, it remains that when it comes to philosophical attitude and motivation, Hirsch is much closer to British common sense and ordinary language philosophy than to Carnap. Throughout the book are sprinkled references to Moore, Austin, Wisdom, Urmson and the later Wittgenstein, and I think those references provide a better key to Hirsch's philosophical thinking. It is appropriate and telling that Hirsch approvingly quotes Wittgenstein's remark about language gone on holiday (p. 102).

I think it is possible to read Hirsch's essays and come away with the sense that the discussions are narrow: that they have no significance for other issues besides the defense of common sense ontology in the case of middle-sized physical objects via some metaontological considerations. Such an assessment would however be mistaken. First, the specific claims Hirsch makes have consequences outside of ontology. Second, Hirsch's argumentative strategy ought to be applicable in other cases as well. I will elaborate on these points in turn.

First, Hirsch rejects the "referential correspondence theory", according to which "in any possible language the truth of a statement depends on the referential relations between its (non-logical) words and objects that exist in the world" (p. 140; see too pp. 41, 234-43). The reason he does so is related to the phenomenon of seeping through, mentioned earlier on. Take someone who speaks a mereological nihilist language, where nihilism is the view that there are no mereologically complex objects, and where in speaking of the language as 'nihilist' I am using the kind of shorthand I mentioned earlier. In her language, sentences like "there are no tables" etc. come out true. She still can and should agree that our sentences "there are no tables" and "t is brown", where 't' names a given brown table, come out true, but she cannot say "this sentence's truth depends on a referential relation between 't' and its referent", for she must say "there is no referent of 't'". She must, in her language, say concerning "t is brown" of our language, "this sentence does not have name-predicate structure".[2] We are ourselves in a similar situation with respect to languages that are -- and here again I use the shorthand -- ontologically more permissive than ours.

I think many theorists would be open to the possibility of there being possible languages fundamentally different in structure from those we are familiar with. But by Hirsch's lights already some apparently fairly superficial differences -- those of having different views, when all is said and done, on quantified sentences -- have fundamental repercussions when it comes to what to say about the structure of the language. In some of the essays (pp. 43, 87-89, and "The Vagueness of Identity", passim) Hirsch uses his rejection of the referential correspondence theory to criticize the idea that the quantifier cannot be semantically indeterminate (something that, for example, Lewis (1986) and Sider (e.g., 2001) have argued).

Of course, insofar as Hirsch's metaontological views are in conflict with entrenched views on foundational issues concerning meaning, one possible reaction, whether in the end justified or not, is that it is Hirsch's metaontological views that should be rejected.

Turn now to the possibility that Hirsch's argumentative strategy may be applicable outside ontology. I think it is plain that his points concerning verbal disputes and common sense ontology should be. After all, he trades on the idea that apparent disagreements over what are regarded as a priori necessities should be regarded as verbal, and many philosophical disagreements are of that general kind. But let me here restrict my remarks to a case Hirsch himself discusses: ethics. He thinks the argumentative strategy would not work there. Discussing Peter Singer's radical recommendations regarding what one should sacrifice for strangers and the possibility of replying to Singer by appeal to an argument parallel to that which Hirsch gives in the case of ontology, he says:

Questions about value cannot be resolved by appeal to ordinary English usage. On one meta-ethical picture, Singer would admit that the "descriptive meaning" he assigns to the words "morally required" is different from that assigned by typical speakers, but the important point is that the "evaluative meaning" of those words is fixed by people's attitudes and behavior. Singer is engaged in a "disagreement of attitude" with ordinary people, and that can't be resolved by straightening out misinterpretations of language. The meta-ethical picture I've just appealed to may be overly crude, but I think the essential point is clear enough. (p. 115)

The remarks are brief, but suggest that the meaning of an evaluative term is an amalgam of descriptive and evaluative meaning. But why should this view (overly crude, as Hirsch stresses) rule out that Hirsch's considerations generalize to the case of ethics? If the meaning of an evaluative term is an amalgam of descriptive and evaluative meaning, then it is sufficient for two speakers to use the term with different meanings that they use the term with different descriptive meaning or with different evaluative meaning. What Hirsch seems to rely upon is a broadly Hare-style view that the descriptive meaning is somehow secondary to the evaluative meaning, and that sameness of evaluative meaning is sufficient for Singer and the common sense moralists not to speak past each other. One interesting question is whether it is only by adopting such a view that Hirsch manages to avoid the consequence that his arguments concerning ontology generalize to the case of ethics.

I have devoted my review to laying out the details of Hirsch's position and the implications of it. There have not been many explicit value judgments concerning Hirsch's essays, but I believe and hope that the tone of the discussion should convey my great admiration for the essays collected in this book, even if I have made some critical points. Lastly, let me briefly remark on a slightly different feature: Hirsch's writing is frequently very entertaining. When writing about opponents he can be harshly rhetorical, and even when he attacks views I sympathize with, I cannot but admire the rhetoric. (A personal favorite of mine is the remark on Sider and "Stalinist semantics", p. 129.) The last essay of the book ends with a 'parable', "Duran's Dilemma", which is both funny and somehow rather poignant. Analytic ontology fiction is not a very big genre -- it will not have its own section of the bookstore any time soon -- but even if it were, I suspect this parable would be one of the best instances of it.[3]


Balaguer, Mark: manuscript, "Why Metaphysical Disputes are Not Merely Verbal … And Why At Least Some of Them are Empty Anyway".

Bennett, Karen: 2009, "Composition, Colocation and Metaontology", in Chalmers, Manley and Wasserman (2009), pp. 38-76.

Chalmers, David: 2009, "Ontological Anti-Realism", in Chalmers, Manley and Wasserman (2009), pp. 77-129.

Chalmers, David, David Manley and Ryan Wasserman (eds.): 2009, Metametaphysics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Dorr, Cian: 2005, "What we Disagree about when we Disagree about Ontology", in Mark Kalderon (ed.), Fictionalist Approaches to Metaphysics, Oxford University Press, Oxford, pp. 234-86.

Eklund, Matti: 2007, "The Picture of Reality as an Amorphous Lump", in Theodore Sider, John Hawthorne and Dean Zimmerman (eds.), Contemporary Debates in Metaphysics, Blackwell, Oxford, pp. 382-96.

Eklund, Matti: 2009, "Carnap and Ontological Pluralism", in Chalmers, Manley and Wasserman (2009), pp. 130-56.

Eklund, Matti: forthcoming, "Carnap's Metaontology", Noûs.

Eklund, Matti: manuscript, "Carnap's Legacy for the Contemporary Metaontological Debate".

Hawthorne, John: 2006, "Plenitude, Convention and Ontology", in Metaphysical Essays, Oxford University Press, Oxford, pp. 53-70.

Hawthorne, John: 2009, "Superficialism in Ontology", in Chalmers, Manley and Wasserman (2009), pp. 213-30.

Koslicki, Kathrin: 2005, "On the Substantive Nature of Disagreements in Ontology", Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 71: 85-105.

Lewis, David: 1983, Philosophical Papers, Volume 1, Oxford University Press, Oxford.

Lewis, David: 1986, On the Plurality of Worlds, Blackwell, Oxford.

McGrath, Matthew: 2008, "Conciliatory Metaontology and the Vindication of Common Sense", Noûs 42: 482-508.

Sider, Theodore: 2001, Four-Dimensionalism. Oxford University Press, Oxford.

Sider, Theodore: 2007, "Neo-Fregeanism and Quantifier Variance", Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Suppl. Vol., 81, 201-32.

Sider, Theodore: 2009, "Ontological Realism", in Chalmers, Manley and Wasserman (2009), pp. 384-423.

Urmson, J. O.: 1956, Philosophical Analysis, Clarendon Press, Oxford.

Williamson, Timothy: 1987-8, "Equivocation and Existence", Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 88: 109-27.

[1] I will keep on talking about the English ‘there is’ as a quantifier. In the present context this is harmless.

[2] The reason for the awkward metalinguistic formulations is that the quoted sentences of the nihilist’s language do not necessarily mean the same as the corresponding sentences of our language.

[3] Many thanks to Eli Hirsch and Dan Korman for helpful comments on an earlier version of this review.