Quantifiers in Language and Logic

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Stanley Peters and Dag Westerståhl, Quantifiers in Language and Logic, Oxford University Press, 2006, 548pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 019929125X.

Reviewed by Johan van Benthem, University of Amsterdam & Stanford University


Two masters of their craft have teamed up, and written a rich and rewarding book right at the interface of natural and formal languages. Quantifiers in Language and Logic is a mature reflection of some 25 years of generalized quantifier theory, a field of research started by Barwise, Cooper, Keenan, Stavi, and others around 1980, against the backdrop of Montague's seminal work. And in the best traditions of that interdisciplinary field, it still takes a joint effort by a prominent linguist and logician to get the true story of talking about and reasoning with quantifiers and the concomitant numerical notions that structure the way in which we present and communicate information, and extract more using various forms of reasoning.

The book contains many of the grand old themes, as well as several new ones. Part I explains how quantifiers like "a", "some", "three", or "most" are among the most pervasive structures by means of which we formulate information, and at the same time, they underlie the basic cognitive processes of counting and computation. Thus, the quantificational repertoire of natural and formal languages has always been a shared concern between linguistics, logic, and the foundations of mathematics -- and insights from one area travel to another: witness the pivotal position of authors like Frege, Montague, or Hintikka at the boundary of several disciplines. And, despite initial appearances in first-order logic, there is much more to quantification than just simple enumeration of properties of individual objects. Semantic discussion continues right until today about the intricacies of quantification in non-countable measure settings ("waiting all of my life"), quantified collective properties and actions, as described by plurals, or just the meaning of interactive quantification like 'doing things together'. Indeed, a sense of such subtleties is also entering computer science, with newer query languages in data base theory, and my sense is that complex forms of quantification will even enter theories of interaction in game theory and social choice theory.

Part II of the book is a masterful survey of major quantificational structures in natural language. We get an in-depth study of the main types of determiner expression, as well as a lucid account of the major formal semantic tools developed over the years to describe them, including set-theoretic structures and numerical representations. Special care is given to detailed semantic accounts of constructions whose precise general analysis has defied researchers for many years, such as possessives and reciprocals. Thus, Chapter 6.3 on "existential there" sentences shows how these seemingly harmless constructions ("there are few natural opiates") pose a health risk to most major semantic views on generalized quantifiers. Chapter 7 on possessives presents the most sophisticated general definition to date for the ubiquitous genitive ending " 's". The authors' solution uses a higher-order operator performing predicate restrictions of two quantifier arguments to some binary possessive relation, which is logically interesting, and which seems to fit the known facts rather well. Finally, Chapter 8 on exceptive constructions ("All numbers are man-made, except for the natural ones") examines the major semantic accounts of today, and then proposes a new view on what an 'exception' is (which in fact dates back to Antiquity, as the authors note) which solves some major current descriptive problems. In summary, Chapters 6, 7, and 8 definitely improve on the state of the art in practising semantics.

In addition to searching for specific truth conditions for important expressions, Part II of the book also studies general types of semantic behaviour in depth. In particular, it tells the story of 'logicality' of quantifiers in terms of invariance of their truth value across isomorphisms between individual domains sometimes called 'permutation invariance'. Also, it gives a comprehensive treatment of what might be called inferential stability under increasing or decreasing denotations for set arguments, making "all penguins walked" imply that all penguins moved, and also, that all female penguins walked. These famous 'monotonicity inferences', upward or downward, eventually go back right to medieval logic.

Intertwined with this sophisticated descriptive apparatus are more theoretical themes which give generalized quantifier theory its distinctive flavour, viz. the formulation of general features of language and general logical results about them. Many of these have to do with the expressive power of natural languages. Given natural semantic constraints on possible denotations of expressions, such as 'extension' or 'conservativity' (different ways of restricting the relevant universes of discourse) what is the space of all possible quantifiers realizing these, and do given languages, natural or formal, have the resources for expressing all of them? One particular focus is the study of polyadic quantifier combinations such as 'resumption' or 'branching', and the border-line of expressive power between natural language and what could be expressed in principle, but not in reality. In addition, the careful study of monotonicity addresses issues of the inferential power of natural language, i.e., the ability to formulate ubiquitous and useful patterns of human reasoning. The book presents a great number of classical results in the area from the 1980s in a clear and elegant style, while adding original observations of its own throughout. In particular, Chapter 9.3 has a neat proposal for one more basic feature of 'logical' expressions, viz. their 'constancy', a key proof-structuring role in valid inference.

Part III of the book adds recent methodological themes from the authors' work, with special emphasis on translation between languages, expressive power, and compositionality of meanings. The framework developed applies to quantifiers, but indeed, across every category of expression in a well-structured language.

Montague's famous Equivalence Thesis stated that there is no difference of principle between formal languages and natural languages. Thus, the marriage between linguistics and logic in this book is natural, and in particular, it seems of interest to also look at the theory of generalized quantifiers as it has developed in mathematical logic, under headings such as abstract model theory, but also elsewhere. Indeed, understanding the design of logical languages can help understand the architecture of human ones, whether designed or the result of some evolutionary process. Part IV of the book develops some of the mathematics of logical languages with non-first-order generalized quantifiers using Ehrenfeucht-Fraïssé games of model comparison, a fine-tuned semantic invariance across models. These chapters are a crash course in the seminal work of Per Lindström in the 1960s and 1970s, and the subsequent Helsinki School of Väänänen, Hella, and others, and they show persuasively how much elegance and insight into expressive power can be achieved by means of a game perspective. Thus, they seem a very natural addition to the 'standard toolkit' of the semantics of natural language.

Of course, one can raise questions about a book of this scope and ambition. E.g., the coverage of quantificational phenomena, though extensive, impressive, and definitive, remains rather 'standard', staying close to classical research lines. None of the exciting more recent work on nonmonotonic reasoning with quantifiers, e.g., in their so-called 'exhaustive readings', is included. Indeed, the 'exceptives' of Chapter 8 would provide a natural handle here, since they are about ways in which we qualify hasty non-monotonic generalizations, perhaps in a revision step added on to a sentence. (Conversely, nonmonotonic logic would profit from learning more about our natural linguistic repertoire here for 'hedging' and revising.) Also, to mention another major quantifier system in natural language, the challenges of plural quantification remain under-represented. And finally, there is no sustained discussion of how classical accounts of generalized quantifiers sit with the delicate dependency structures central to so much recent work on quantification, by Hintikka, van Lambalgen, or Väänänen. These topics seem pressing, since it seems a legitimate question to ask how well generalized quantifier theory sits with more recent semantic waves starting from the 1980s, which all involved quantification in new ways, such as nonmonotonic reasoning, dynamic semantics, or game logics of (in-)dependence in interpretation. Of course, instead of listing topics not covered, one could say just as well that, once in possession of this book, we are in a much better position to see now what such an enriched version of generalized quantifier theory should look like.

As for what ís included, I felt that a bit more might have been said about the 'semantic universals' of the 1980s, and in particular, about the intriguing 'impossibility results' from the 1980s showing how certain types of quantifier cannot occur. Also, on the linguistics/logic interface, I missed some samples of other sophisticated techniques which have been used in the 1980s to obtain non-trivial results about natural language quantifiers, such as Kruskal's Theorem from graph theory. And looking at another aspect, some new proposals in the book remain sketchy. E.g., the definition of inferential 'constancy' made in the book is interesting, but the authors do not bother to check whether it applies to simple formal languages, singling out, say, the basic Boolean operations inside propositional logic. Indeed, even this simple question seems non-trivial to me!

Next, even though the book is well-composed and well-reflected, there are several places where one would like to see more general discussion by the authors. For instance, how happy is the marriage between the natural language parts of the book and the last part on abstract model theory? I have put a nice spin on it in the above text, but the book does not draw things together all that much. For instance, are the model comparison games employed throughout just a gadget, or do they have some intrinsic semantic value as an account of meaning? And if so, what is the connection with semantic games in the tradition of Hintikka and his students, which have opened up new connections between linguistics, logic, and game theory? Some of the key topics in the book, like branching quantifiers, are also among the paradigmatic examples there: what is the connection?

But maybe the most striking limitation of the book is its silence on computational aspects of quantification. Much work in logic is on the boundary between expressive power and algorithmic complexity of model checking or validity testing for formal languages. Some such connections date back to the early days of generalized quantifier theory, with the work on 'semantic automata' forming a hierarchy of different types of quantifier in terms of their associated procedures. In the meantime, much is also known about the model-checking complexity of languages with generalized quantifiers -- and recent work (e.g., by Merlijn Sevenster in his 2006 ILLC dissertation) has taken this to polyadic quantifiers of the sort studied in this book. I hope that the authors will find a way of including this perspective in the future, as it seems to be a natural fit with what they already have. In particular, it is this balance between expressive power and computational complexity, and the architectures maintaining it, which seems essential to the actual cognitive functioning of quantification -- no matter how careful one has to be here about equating computational complexity with what humans experience as 'difficulty'. Intriguing studies by Geurts, Clark & Grossman, and Knauff are now beginning to take monotonicity inference, and issues of expressive power into the realm of empirically testable neuroscience.

I have spent some 3 pages on describing what was included, and about 1 on listing what was not. Of course, a book of 548 pages can do only so much. And what it does do is this: Peters and Westerståhl show that generalized quantifier theory is a beautiful structure at the interface of linguistics, logic, mathematics, and philosophy -- and that its unique blend of linguistic observation and logical theory has lost none of its attraction. My additional comments show that this role can be enhanced, and in particular, they suggest that generalized quantifier theory may metamorphose into something even richer if it manages to absorb further influences from computer science, cognitive science, and perhaps even game theory.

In summary: a book to have, a book to buy, and a book to take further!