Quantum Nonlocality and Reality: 50 Years of Bell's Theorem

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Mary Bell and Shan Gao (eds.), Quantum Nonlocality and Reality: 50 Years of Bell's Theorem, Cambridge University Press, 2016, 441pp., $163.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107104341.

Reviewed by Ward Struyve, KU Leuven


Locality has always been held a sacred principle of fundamental physical theories. Non-local theories have often been regarded as provisional, phenomenological accounts, waiting to be replaced by more fundamental local theories. For example, Newton's theory of gravity is a non-local theory. It describes particles that attract each other with certain forces that act instantaneously. If one of the particles were to be displaced, this would have an instantaneous (albeit possibly very small) effect on the other particles. Newton himself saw this as an unacceptable feature of the theory, stating [1]:

that one body may act upon another at a distance through a vacuum without the mediation of any thing else . . . is to me so great an absurdity that I believe no man who has in philosophical matters any competent faculty of thinking can ever fall into it. Gravity must be caused by an Agent acting constantly according to certain laws . . .

Coulomb's law, which describes the force between static charged particles, is analogous to Newton's gravitational force and is also non-local. However, the work of Maxwell and others made clear that electromagnetism (given by Maxwell's equations and the Lorentz force law, from which Coulomb's law can be derived) can be understood as a completely local theory, with interactions between the charges being mediated by the electromagnetic field. Such a local account for gravity had to wait a bit longer until the advent of Einstein's theory of general relativity. According to Einstein's theory, which subsumes Newton's theory in the non-relativistic limit, gravity acts not by non-local forces but by the geometry of space-time whose changes propagate locally.

However, the world is not classical but quantum mechanical. Quantum mechanics is non-local, in the same way as Newtonian gravity, in the sense that there exist interactions between events in space-time that can only be connected by signals moving faster than the speed of light. However, unlike Newtonian gravity, the non-locality of quantum mechanics is not an artifact of the provisional nature of the theory. Rather, any possible alternative for quantum mechanics must be non-local, at least if it is to agree with certain predictions of quantum mechanics. Since these predictions seem to be well confirmed by experiments, the non-locality is inescapable. This striking conclusion follows from John Bell's theorem. To celebrate its 50th anniversary, Mary Bell (John's wife) and Shan Gao collected a broad selection of papers on Bell and his work on the foundations of quantum mechanics.

The book has four parts. The first focuses on Bell. The second part deals with Bell's theorem, gving a detailed exposition of the theorem and the experimental results. The third concerns the nature of non-locality and the last part concerns "non-local realistic theories". These are theories that provide a clear ontology,  -- e.g. many-worlds theories, spontaneous collapse theories and Bohmian mechanics -- which form alternatives to orthodox quantum mechanics. The attention to such theories is quite appropriate since Bell's preoccupation was not only with the non-local nature of quantum mechanics. Even though he was employing the theory on a daily basis as a high energy physicist working in CERN, he was deeply troubled with the formulation of the theory. He found it unprofessionally vague and ambiguous. He demanded a precise mathematical and conceptual formulation of quantum mechanics. In particular, this implies being precise about the ontology of the theory. Or to use the terminology he introduced, it is important to be clear about what are the "beables" in the theory, i.e., the physical entities that are supposed to exist independently of being observed or not. Therefore he was a great supporter of theories such as Bohmian mechanics (also called de Broglie-Bohm theory) and spontaneous collapse theories, which meet those demands. Actually, it was his appreciation of Bohmian mechanics with its explicit non-locality that got him to start thinking about whether it was possible to formulate a theory that is as precise as this one, yet is local. His theorem showed that this was impossible.

Even though the book's four parts cover different topics, there is (quite naturally) no strict division of the papers. For example, recollections of Bell are not only in Part I (with contributions from Andrew Whitaker, Michael Nauenberg and Giancarlo Ghirardi). Many of the other papers contain recollections as well. In addition, discussions on the nature of non-locality often go together with consideration of precise versions of quantum mechanics. In reviewing the book, we will not strictly follow the chapter order.

Part II starts with contributions by Jean Bricmont and Roderich Tumulka, who carefully examine what Bell's theorem actually proves and and what, exactly, it assumes. While the theorem is technically easy, its implications have -- to this day -- often been misunderstood. The non-locality is unacceptable to many, and unwarranted claims are often made about assumptions underlying Bell's theorem. Rather than giving up locality we could give up one of these assumptions. For example, it is often claimed that Bell's theorem requires assumptions like realism or determinism. In this context it is often stated that Bell's theorem disproves local realism (as, unfortunately, in the book's preface, which suggests the assumptions of both locality and realism, whatever the latter may exactly mean). However, this is mistaken; Bricmont and Tumulka do a great job in rectifying these and other misconceptions. These contributions are good additions to previous discussions, e.g., the excellent exposition of Goldstein, Norsen et al. [2].

The misconception that realism is an assumption made by Bell unfortunately features in Marco Genovese's well-presented chapter on experimental tests of Bell's inequalities. (Genovese discusses the very recent and important loophole-free experiments of the Delft group in an appendix added after submission.) But there are problems with Genovese's introduction to Bell's theorem and and his discussion of its conclusions. Genovese states that Bell's theorem assumes "realism" in addition to locality. What is meant in this case by "realism" is just determinism. But as explained in the contributions by Bricmont and Tumulka, Bell never assumed determinism. He explicitly warned against it. In the first version of his theorem (1964) Bell derived determinism from locality using the EPR argument, while in a later (1976) version (which avoids the assumption of perfect anti-correlation for the singlet state in the EPR argument) the variables in the theory determine the outcomes probabilistically. So Genovese's conclusion that the experimental tests make "it possible to exclude any possible deterministic extension of quantum mechanics" is just wrong. Even stated as such, Bohmian mechanics would be a counterexample because it is deterministic and reproduces the predictions of quantum mechanics. The conclusion should be that the test makes it possible to exclude any local theory, whether it be deterministic or stochastic.

It is correct that Bell's theorem has assumptions other than locality. Locality might be preserved if one of these other assumptions is given up. But these assumptions are quite natural and are usually taken for granted. For example, it is assumed that settings for measurements can be chosen independently of the system on which the measurement is performed (also called the "free will assumption" or perhaps better the "no conspiracy assumption"). However, giving up this assumption in order to save locality would make the theory incredibly conspiratorial, making any kind of scientific inquiry impossible [2]. Another example is described in Trevor Norsen's contribution. One may think our experience of the world is merely an illusion and that what happens in the actual world is completely local. However, our experiences, which in this case are brain-in-a-vat-like, give the impression of non-locality. Another possibility is that the structure of space-time is different than assumed. For example, in his theorem Bell tacitly assumed that the topology of space-time is simply connected. If space-time is multiply connected it may be that systems that appear widely separated are actually close by, perhaps connected by something like a wormhole [3]. The non-locality could be merely apparent if entangled systems are connected like this. But, of course, whether such an idea can be further developed remains to be seen.

Another assumption in Bell's theorem is that experiments have definite outcomes. In the Many Worlds theory (also called the Everett theory) this assumption is violated. But this does not necessarily mean that the theory is local. One can still check directly whether a particular theory is local or not. In the usual version of the theory, the wave function is the only beable. It is not a local beable, i.e., a beable associated to some region in space-time. As explained in detail by Norsen, the fact that there are no local beables means that the theory is neither local or non-local, because the theory lacks the kind of structure necessary for an analysis. Norsen goes on to discuss versions of the Many Worlds theory that do include local beables. While the situation is not so clear in that case, he argues that such theories seem non-local. On the other hand, Harvey R. Brown and Christopher G. Timpson claim that the Many Worlds theory does violate locality, without specifying any local beables. They talk about systems localized in certain regions in space and localized measurements, but it is unclear to what extent we should understand this literally. If the wave function is all there is, then the physical arena does not seem to be physical space (or space-time) but rather configuration space or perhaps some Hilbert space. As is convincingly argued by Norsen, this means that one cannot meaningfully discuss the possibility of locality in that case. Lev Vaidman is explicit in stating that in the Many Worlds theory, the wave function in configuration space is all that exists, but also claims that there is non-locality.

However, this is not Brown and Timpson's main point. They also claim that while the theory is non-local (they refer to "local-causality" instead of "locality"), the theory does not have action-at-a-distance and therefore is not at variance with relativity. A similar stance is taken by Vaidman and Wayne Myrvold. Myrvold not only considers the Many Worlds theory, but makes the case in general that non-locality can be violated in two ways, namely, parameter dependence and outcome dependence. The former means dependence on the choice of experiment (e.g. the choice of direction along which the spin is measured), while the latter means dependence on the outcome of an experiment. For example, Bohmian mechanics violates the former, while spontaneous collapse theories violate the latter. It is argued (as, e.g., Shimony has done) that parameter dependence is in clear conflict with relativity, while outcome dependence is not, since it may preserve the relativistic causal structure. These are interesting considerations. Indeed an interesting question is what should be demanded of a proper relativistic theory in the light of the violation of locality. At least, it seems that, just as in the case of the discussion on locality, space-time itself and local beables should figure in a proper relativistic theory.

Bernard D'Espagnat argues that locality may be maintained if somehow the notion of reality depends on the observer, as in a theory such as Rovelli's Relational Quantum Mechanics. I am not sure what exactly exists in the world according to such a theory, i.e., what type of beables there are. If this means that there are no local beables, then again Norsen's arguments apply. This is unfortunately not addressed in this contribution.

Henry P. Stapp's contribution concerns an apparent weakening of the assumptions in Bell's theorem. Specifically, he attempts to remove the "hidden-variable assumption" and a weakening of Bell's locality assumption. There have been criticisms of this work before: see [4], for example, for a detailed discussion that concludes that the locality assumption is not weakened. Concerning the hidden-variable assumption, Bell makes no such assumption either. As clearly explained in Bricmont's and Tumulka's contributions, Bell derives the existence of such variables merely from locality using the EPR argument.

Gao suggests that non-locality implies the existence of a preferred Lorentz frame and, therefore, an incompatibility with the theory of relativity. The argument is based on the observation that a non-local signal implies the existence of a preferred Lorentz frame, namely the frame where the signal is instantaneous. But the argument is not correct. Given a relativistic theory, the evolution of the matter may determine particular Lorentz frames (and generically will determine many), but this does not imply a violation of relativity. For example, a single world-line in a relativistic theory determines at each instant a preferred Lorentz frame, namely the instantaneous rest frame. As another example, the center of mass frame corresponding to a matter distribution may determine a particular Lorentz frame. However, in such cases these frames do not at all violate relativity. On the other hand, if the formulation of a theory requires a preferred Lorentz frame as an extra space-time structure (in addition to Minkowski space-time), then clearly this violates relativity. As stated before, what exactly constitutes a relativistic theory in light of the non-locality is not so clear. But the mere existence of a Lorentz frame because of the matter content does not constitute a violation of relativity. In the context of Bohmian theories, this is discussed in detail in [5].

Bell's original formulation of his theorem amounts to an inequality for an entangled pair of spin-1/2 particles that has to be satisfied by local theories and which happens to be violated by quantum mechanics. By considering three spin-1/2 particles, we can extend the theorem to one without inequalities. This theorem (by Greenberger, Horne and Zeilinger) and its history is discussed in detail by Olival Freire Jr. and Osvaldo Pessoa Jr.

The last part of the book contains discussions about what were called "non-local realistic theories". It concerns the formulation of precise versions of quantum mechanics that are not plagued by the conceptual problems that face orthodox quantum mechanics. The most discussed problem with orthodox quantum mechanics is the measurement problem. One way to phrase this problem is that there are two types of evolution for the wave function, namely the Schrödinger evolution and the collapse of the wave function. The latter is supposed to interrupt the Schrödinger evolution whenever a measurement is performed. But the notion of measurement is rather vague. Exactly which physical processes constitute measurements? Do they need to involve humans? Or only humans with PhDs? As long as this is not clear, the theory is rather ambiguous and it cannot be regarded as a fundamental theory of nature, despite the fact that it turns out to be very successful for practical purposes. Bell often insisted on this, most strongly in "Against measurement". Gregg Jaeger discusses this in detail in the book, as well as possible ways to overcome the problem, for particular spontaneous collapse theories.

The way the measurement problem was just phrased may suggest that the problem stems from the dynamics. However, this is not so. There is a deeper problem which has to do with the ontology of orthodox quantum mechanics: it is unclear what exactly the ontology is. For example, while the wave function clearly plays an important role, its exact status is not so clear. Should it be considered as part of the ontology or not (i.e., be regarded as merely epistemic)? Does it constitute the complete ontology or not? (E.g., if measurements are considered classical devices they are perhaps required to be described by an additional piece of classical ontology.) A precise version of quantum mechanics requires a precise ontology, i.e., a precise statement about what are the beables in the theory. As already discussed, there are two types of beables, namely local ones and non-local ones. Bell was not only concerned with local beables in the context of the discussion on non-locality, but also in the context of formulating an adequate physical theory. The theory should make contact with the empirical data and these have to do with macroscopic structures in ordinary space or space-time. Theories without local beables face the challenge of making this contact. This role of local beables is a recurring theme of Bell, and Tim Maudlin nicely collects these passages and adds further discussion and explanation.

The main proposals for precise versions of quantum theories are Bohmian mechanics, Many Worlds theory and spontaneous collapse theories. In the non-relativistic version, Bohmian mechanics is about point-particles moving in physical space under the influence of the wave function, which obeys Schrödinger's equation at all times. So the local beables are point-particles. Bohm's papers were a revelation for Bell as they showed that a precise version of quantum mechanics was indeed possible. About half of Bell's papers on the foundations of quantum mechanics deal with Bohmian mechanics. In one of these papers, Bell even formulated a Bohmian version quantum field theory. Goldstein has collected various of these passages on Bohmian mechanics that illustrate Bell's appreciation for the theory and the insights that arise from it. Further discussion on Bohmian mechanics, in particular in relation to non-locality, is found in Basil J. Hiley's contribution.

Bell was also excited about spontaneous collapse theories. In such theories, collapses happen as random objective processes. Just like Bohmian mechanics, these are precise theories and often feature in Bell's papers. Philip Pearle and Giancarlo Ghirardi share reminiscences of their interactions with Bell, which were important for the development of the theory. There is an ongoing discussion about whether there should also be local beables in the theory in addition to the wave function. Ghirardi touches upon this with his proposed mass density as the local beable. Spontaneous collapse theories are also discussed by Stephen L. Adler, who argues in his contribution that the origin of the collapse comes from (classical) gravity.

Other alternatives to orthodox quantum mechanics are discussed in the book. For example, Yakir Aharonov and Eliahu Cohen discuss the two-state-vector formalism and issues with non-locality using weak values. Unfortunately, they give no real explanation of the formalism (apart from the fact that there is a forward and backward evolving wave function). This made it hard to see the relevance of the weak values in relation to non-locality.

The book contains more contributions than the ones I have touched upon. That is not to say that these are somehow less interesting. I think this is overall a very nice anthology, with high-level contributions. They cover a broad range of topics related to Bell's work on the foundations of quantum mechanics, ranging from topics on locality to the structure of physical theories. The recollections provide good insight into Bell as a person. Some of the contributions are introductory while others go into the theory in more depth. The summaries of the contributions in the preface are well done. The contributors are a well-balanced mix of both physicists and philosophers. I warmly recommend this book to anyone interested in this important and fascinating aspect of the quantum world.


[1] I. Newton, Letter to Richard Bentley, Source: 189.R.4.47, ff. 7-8, Trinity College Library, Cambridge, UKLetters to Bentley, 1692/3

[2] S. Goldstein, T. Norsen, D.V. Tausk, N. Zanghì,  Bell's theorem. Scholarpedia.6(10):8378 (2011). 

[3] P. Holland, The quantum theory of motion, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge (1993)

[4] T. Norsen, "Bell Locality and the Nonlocal Character of Nature", Foundations of Physics Letters, 19(7), 633-655 (2006)

[5] D. Dürr, S. Goldstein, T. Norsen, W. Struyve and N. Zanghì, 'Can Bohmian mechanics be made relativistic?', Proc. Roy. Soc. A 470, 20130699 (2014)