Quantum Objects: Non-Local Correlation, Causality and Objective Indefiniteness in the Quantum World

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Gregg Jaeger, Quantum Objects: Non-Local Correlation, Causality and Objective Indefiniteness in the Quantum World, Springer, 2014, 203pp., $129.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783642376283.

Reviewed by Andrew Wayne, University of Guelph


The founders of quantum theory recognized in the 1920s that the atomic and subatomic world behaves very differently than the classical world with which we are familiar. The theory they developed includes distinctively quantum concepts of discreteness, interference, indefinite magnitudes and objective chance. Work by John S. Bell and others since the 1960s has taught us that this world is also non-local, violating a fundamental principle of classical science. The failure of locality, the lack of any coherent (classical) particle concept and contravention of (classical) causality have often been taken to imply that the prospects are dim for a realist interpretation of quantum theory.

Gregg Jaeger is more sanguine. The extraordinary empirical success of quantum theory means that we must take these radical concepts seriously. The premise of his new book is that we have not yet taken them seriously enough. Jaeger urges that the conceptual structure of quantum theory, combined with a realist orientation to science, requires a transformation of the basic metaphysics of physical objects and of causation. As he puts it, this is nothing less than a Copernican revolution in our understanding of the content and structure of the world. Jaeger's goal is to "pursue an interpretation of quantum mechanics that helps provide a world picture in which the most general and long-satisfactory categories such as individual object and cause continue to hold" (p. 109).

Jaeger stakes out a realist interpretive approach to quantum theory, in which quantities contained in the theory truly describe properties and objects of the quantum world. Jaeger begins by reviewing the formalism of non-relativistic quantum mechanics, with a particular emphasis on the concept of particle. He notes that particles have a very different nature in the quantum domain: they remain discrete entities, but they only sometimes have definite positions or trajectories, and crucially they lack both classical substantiality and primitive thisness. Jaeger also discusses non-local correlations, focusing on the pioneering work of Bell. Bell locality requires that the probability of an event cannot be changed by conditionalizing on another event at spacelike separation. The well-known experimental violation of Bell locality means that the probability of a quantum event does sometimes depend on events not just in its own past light cone (its past causal history) but also on events elsewhere in the space and time. In response to these challenges, the realist ontology for quantum theory Jaeger develops includes three major elements: objectively real unsharp physical magnitudes, quantum individuals as basic objects, and quantum causation. Along the way, Jaeger offers somewhat technical accounts of a wide array of foundational issues in the interpretation of quantum theory.

According to Jaeger, elements of reality may be "objectively indefinite" (p. 5). Classically, to say that an object has a property, such as mass, means that the object must have exactly one physical magnitude of that property. By contrast, a quantum object may have a property -- for example, position, momentum or spin -- but not have a definite physical magnitude for that property. For Jaeger, this indefinite magnitude is a real property of the object, but it is a property in a "mode of physical being intermediate between those of non-existence and actuality" (p. 58). Jaeger labels this mode of being, following Abner Shimony, quantum potentiality (Shimony 1993). The mathematical representation of these potentialities within the formalism is by means of the complex quantum state amplitude coefficients. Thus the reduction of the wave packet in measurement is explained as "a metaphysical transition of mode of being, namely, the actualization of a specific potentiality" (p. 104). When what Jaeger calls a sharp observable (represented by a self-adjoint operator) is measured, the outcomes given by the Born rule are elements of reality with a "degree of reality" equal to one. Jaeger is ontologically committed to a wider category of observables that includes unsharp observables, represented by positive-operator-valued measures (POM). When these are measured, the outcomes are potential elements of reality, each with a degree of reality less than one. In this way, Jaeger claims, we have a realist interpretation of unsharp magnitudes such as the joint measurement of position and momentum, resulting in mean values and uncertainties for each quantity.

Also needed on Jaeger's realist approach is a metaphysics for quantum causation. The failure of locality means that no classical account of probabilistic causality will be sufficient. According to Jaeger, quantum potentialities are the elements of reality that determine the future state of the system, so these are appropriate candidates for quantum causes. The effects are the future states themselves, or more precisely actual measurement outcomes. Jaeger notes that these sorts of cause-effect relations satisfy some general metaphysical constraints on causal theories: the effects occur later than their causes, and where the likelihood of a measurement outcome given by the Born rule is non-zero, probabilistic causes increase the likelihood of their effects.

Finally, the most important component of Jaeger's realist metaphysics is his notion of a quantum object. He begins by assuming that any acceptable object ontology satisfies Leibniz's principle of identity of indiscernibles (PII). He recognizes that this application of PII appears problematic, since bosons (such as photons) seem to be both indiscernible and distinct according to quantum mechanics. It would seem that either quantum mechanics is an incomplete theory (such that bosons actually are discernible by means of hidden variables), or PII is false in the quantum domain. Jaeger accepts neither horn of this dilemma and instead rejects the idea that indiscernible bosons are quantum objects at all. Jaeger recognizes that traditional approaches to the individuation of objects quickly run into insurmountable difficulties in the quantum domain, whether they rely on some version of primitive thisness or on space-time individuation. Jaeger proposes as an alternative his quantum principle of individuation (QPI): "A system is an individual if and only if its state is entirely specifiable by a ray in the Hilbert space associated with it" (p. 154). This is a version of the "ray view" characterized by Tim Maudlin. These individuatable particles, and objects built up from particles, form Jaeger's ontology of the objects of the quantum domain.

Jaeger takes as a consequence of QPI that in the case of a system with entangled sub-systems, such as entangled photons in a Bell-type setup, these sub-systems are not individuals and hence not quantum entities. He notes that since the degree of entanglement of subsystems can depend on the choice of basis, QPI does not in general pick out a unique ontology of quantum individuals. What QPI does do, Jaeger emphasizes, is allow for the application of PII to the quantum domain. Jaeger briefly discusses quantum field theory, including the Fock space formulation, and asks whether the field quanta therein are "objectively existing particles" (p. 162). His answer is that they are, based on their discreteness, point-likeness, countability and other properties. Field quanta are "our best candidates for the specific quantum objects supporting a world picture with an intuitive ontological structure largely consistent with current scientific education and practice" (p. 163). What is puzzling is that these field quanta are in general both indiscernible and non-individuatable, and thus fail to satisfy both PII and QPI, yet Jaeger seems to admit them into his ontology of quantum objects.

Jaeger covers a large number of topics in a short space, so his discussion is necessarily selective. Nonetheless, he arrives at his main ontological conclusions via a series of conceptual leaps that often appear inadequately motivated or supported. It would have been helpful if he had engaged with a wider range of investigations within analytic metaphysics and philosophy of physics directly relevant to the claims he develops.

Jaeger's account of quantum objects, for instance, begins with the assertion that PII is true. This assumption is already controversial in the classical domain, with many philosophers holding, for example, that numerically distinct objects can be indiscernible and their individuality underwritten by their primitive thisness. As noted above, in the quantum domain, indiscernible bosons provide much stronger reasons to reject PII. Indeed, rejecting PII has led to a large and productive investigation of the quantum particle concept in philosophy of physics, an investigation that is directly relevant to the main aims of Jaeger's book but with which the book does not engage. The "Received View," as Steven French and Décio Krause dub it, holds that quantum particles may be indiscernible and lack primitive thisness (French and Krause 2006). This metaphysical position has been expressed metaphorically as dollars in a bank account: the dollars are discrete and aggregable (countable), but they are not individually discernible or possessing of primitive thisness (the analogy is originally due to Schrödinger; see Teller 1995). Thus, there is no fact of the matter whether the dollar you take out of your account today is the same individual as the dollar you deposited yesterday. Teller argues persuasively that the Received View offers a successful ontology for the basic constituents of the quantum domain, including entangled states and Fock-state descriptions of field quanta (Teller 1995, Chs. 2 and 3). French and Krause have developed a formal framework to underpin the Received View (French and Krause 2006, Ch. 4). Jaeger makes no mention of the Received View or of Teller's well-known argument, nor does he engage with the pioneering work of French and his collaborators over the past two decades on identity, individuation and quantum ontology.

Similarly, Jaeger claims that the metaphysics of unsharp properties in the quantum realm is best given in terms of Shimony's potentiality interpretation. On this approach, we are left at bottom with an ontology of free-floating potentialities producing and explaining actual states of affairs. And as we saw above, these elements of reality have various "degrees of reality." Jaeger does not consider the challenges faced by such an ontology, for example, what it means to say that one entity has a lower degree of reality than another. Nor does he consider alternative approaches that are well developed in the literature. Metaphysicians have long been concerned with the question of whether fundamental physical quantities need be maximally determinate. David Armstrong and David Lewis claim that they do. Some contemporary metaphysicians, such as Jessica Wilson, disagree. Her metaphysics provides an actual, not potential, ontology of basic determinable properties -- unsharp physical magnitudes -- that in turn ground the modal facts (about potentiality, for instance) so central not just to quantum theory, but also to the rest of science (Wilson 2009, Wilson 2012).

Jaeger's project is realist, and like most realists his motivations are explanatory. As he puts it, "only realism can explain the instrumental reliability of scientific methodology" (p. 126). He says that the particle concept continues to be valuable in quantum mechanics in order to provide "physical explanations" of quantum phenomena (p. 26). By contrast, an operational (anti-realist) particle concept should be rejected because it fails to explain. Similarly, "The potentiality interpretation enables the explanation of definite measurement outcomes" (p. 114), and this is a reason in its favour.

Philosophers unsympathetic to realist interpretations of quantum theory will be unpersuaded by Jaeger's book. However, even realist philosophers, ones who accept that inference to the best explanation arguments can justify ontological claims about theoretical entities, may not find Jaeger's metaphysical claims convincing. At a minimum, what realists like Jaeger must do is make good on their explanatory promises. This means positing an ontology free from inconsistency and free from major lacunae, one motivated and supported by the kinds of considerations realist metaphysicians and philosophers of physics find compelling -- precision, simplicity, resolving problems in previous ontologies, and so on. It also means showing how these ontological posits function in bona fide scientific explanations. Much work remains to be done to show how Jaeger's concepts of quantum cause, quantum potentiality and individuatable quantum objects explain the observable phenomena of the quantum domain.


French, Steven and Decio Krause. 2006. Identity in Physics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Shimony, Abner. 1993. Search for a Naturalistic World View, Volume II: Natural Science and Metaphysics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Teller, Paul. 1995. An Interpretive Introduction to Quantum Field Theory. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

Wilson, Jessica. 2009. "Determination, Realization and Mental Causation." Philosophical Studies 145: 149-169.

---. 2012. "Fundamental Determinables." Philosophers' Imprint 12(4): 1-17.