Quantum Ontology: A Guide to the Metaphysics of Quantum Mechanics

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Peter J. Lewis, Quantum Ontology: A Guide to the Metaphysics of Quantum Mechanics, Oxford University Press, 2016, 207pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780190469818.

Reviewed by Charles T. Sebens, University of California, San Diego


The revolution in physics that brought us to a quantum picture of the world was so radical that it does not merely force a rethinking of physics, but metaphysics as well. Quantum physics may imply that the world is fundamentally indeterministic, that it is fundamentally indeterminate, that causes are not always local to their effects, that there are many more than three spatial dimensions, that wholes are not simply sums of their parts, that our world is just one among many, etc. According to Peter J. Lewis, "we can say quite confidently that quantum mechanics is metaphysically revisionary even if it is not clear what form the revisions should take." (p. xvii) The reason it is so hard to say what the implications of quantum mechanics are for metaphysics is that physicists and philosophers have developed a variety of alternative theories that all attempt to explain why quantum experiments turn out the way they do. These theories disagree on what exists and what rules that stuff obeys. That is, they disagree about the ontology of quantum mechanics and the physical laws that govern that ontology. Understanding the various alternatives and their metaphysical implications is not easy, but Lewis makes it remarkably accessible. Quantum Ontology is an outstanding guide to contemporary philosophy of quantum mechanics.

The book's intended audience is philosophers who are knowledgeable about metaphysics and curious about the relevance of quantum mechanics to metaphysical debates. For this audience, the book is ideal. Lewis relentlessly avoids overly technical presentations of the physics, using simple examples and helpful visualizations to get to the heart of the matter at hand. The questions that drive the text are questions of metaphysics and the metaphysical motivation for whatever is being discussed is always made clear.

Unfortunately, these features make the book less than ideal for physicists who have not already decided that discussions of the metaphysics of quantum mechanics are relevant to physics. The lack of formal calculations and the cursory treatment of certain aspects of the physics (e.g., Stern-Gerlach experiments) can be frustrating to a reader with training in physics. Further, such readers may not have the familiarity with metaphysical questions, nor the interest in answering them, that Lewis expects.

I think that philosophers of physics will find this book valuable not for the novelty of its arguments -- most of the points made here have been made elsewhere, by Lewis or others -- but because of the wide view it provides. By thoughtfully connecting recent works in the philosophy of physics, Lewis has produced an impressively wide-ranging and impeccably organized large-scale perspective. Such a perspective is difficult to achieve through reading primary sources, in part because many works are written by advocates of certain interpretations of quantum mechanics. Lewis does not hesitate to take sides on specific questions, but overall his presentation is quite balanced. However, like many philosophers, he prefers realist versions of quantum mechanics over those that do not attempt to describe what's really happening. As Lewis puts it on p. 43, "It is the business of science to describe the world . . . Unforeseen challenges in providing an empirically adequate description do not warrant giving up."

A final potential audience is students. In my opinion, this is the best textbook available for teaching the philosophy of quantum mechanics. David Z. Albert's Quantum Mechanics and Experience is another fine choice, but there has been much progress in the field since its publication. Lewis's book focuses on the current status of debates in the field, as is evidenced by the fact that more than half of the references are to sources published in the last couple decades (all after Albert's book). Also, Lewis's book is an easier read than Albert's for an already tough subject.

The first three chapters give an excellent introduction to the philosophy of quantum mechanics. The later chapters give overviews of various metaphysical debates. These overviews are useful maps of the territory from which one can decide what ideas to explore further. At times the maps are so far zoomed out that they can be hard to understand if you have not spent time in any of the locales they describe. Still, there is a place for such maps amongst a traveler's supplies. The value of these maps for teaching purposes will depend on one's pedagogical predilections -- whether one prefers training students in on-the-ground mountaineering or general geography.

The first chapter presents a quick and easy-to-follow bare bones account of quantum mechanics -- just what's needed to get the philosophical discussion going. Lewis presents quantum mechanics as a theory of matrix mechanics and then, in the continuum limit, as a theory of wave mechanics. He gives a clear visual explanation of the use of different bases for spin, which nicely sets up the proof of Bell's theorem in chapter 2. All of this is done without requiring the reader to multiply matrices or manipulate complex numbers. Some concepts from calculus appear in this chapter and later, but only a qualitative understanding of them is required.

As Lewis presents it in the first chapter, quantum mechanics "dodges the question" of what's really going on in the physical world by introducing a measurement postulate which says only what we should expect to see if we measure a particle. Quantum mechanics "is a theory in which we have no idea what we are talking about, because we have no idea what (if anything) the basic mathematical structures of the theory represent." (p. 23) This sets up the main question of the text. "How could the world be such that the theory of quantum mechanics is true of it?" (p. 25) What is the ontology of quantum mechanics?

In chapter 2 Lewis defends the sensibility of asking this question by addressing two no-go theorems which one might take to show that it is impossible to give an ontology for quantum mechanics. One is the Kochen-Specker theorem, which can be resisted by rejecting the idea that measurements straightforwardly reveal the preexisting properties of the system being measured. Another is Bell's theorem, which Lewis builds up to by first presenting the EPR argument and Bohr's response to it. Lewis takes Bell's theorem to ultimately rely on three key assumptions: locality, independence of the measurement settings from the spin properties of the particles, and uniqueness of measurement outcomes. Lewis explains how each could be rejected.

There is a more direct way to defend the possibility of giving an ontology for quantum mechanics and that is to give one. There appear to be multiple ways to do this. These are often called "interpretations" of quantum mechanics, but Lewis more accurately characterizes them as alternative physical theories. In this book Lewis focuses on the three proposals that have been most discussed among philosophers of physics: GRW theory, Bohm's theory, and the many-worlds theory. If the quantum wave function always obeys its quantum wave equation, measurements will generally fail to have single definite outcomes. The many-worlds theory embraces this. Every outcome occurs, each in its own world. GRW theory modifies the wave equation by introducing collapse events to ensure that measurements will always have definite outcomes. Bohm's theory involves a different modification. In addition to the wave function obeying its wave equation, Bohm's theory includes particles whose paths depend on the wave function.

Lewis presents up-to-date and efficient introductions to these three theories in chapter 3. The mathematical modifications of GRW and Bohm's theory are explained verbally and visually so that the reader does not have to understand the new equations. Lewis is skilled at making tricky points about these interpretations easy to understand -- such as why one particle's collapse can lead to the collapse of others in GRW or how worlds split in the many-worlds theory.

Getting all of the alternatives on the table early allows for instructive and insightful comparisons between the three interpretations throughout the book. This organizational strategy pays off immediately with a discussion of the fascinating philosophical problem of whether Bohm's theory and GRW theory really succeed in avoiding the multiple worlds of the many-worlds theory.

Chapter 4 addresses the metaphysical question of whether aspects of the world -- not just our language -- can be indeterminate. Lewis begins by considering the bare theory, which, like the many-worlds theory, eschews collapse but, unlike the many-worlds theory, interprets experiments as having indeterminate results (not multiple results). This theory involves unacceptable widespread indeterminacy. Lewis examines why precisely the indeterminacy is unacceptable, recounting Barrett's contention that the theory is empirically incoherent but concluding that the real problem is that the theory is semantically incoherent: "the bare theory is, if true, meaningless." (p. 86)

All three of the theories introduced earlier appear to contain a less widespread sort of indeterminacy. For example, particles will often be in states of indeterminate spin. Exactly when depends on how one modifies the infamous eigenstate-eigenvalue link, and Lewis considers a few options. Here again the stress on comparative analysis is very helpful -- Lewis shows that the problem of modifying the eigenstate-eigenvalue link is just as much a problem for many-worlds and Bohm's theory as it is a problem for GRW. However, as Lewis notes in section 4.5, it may not be a problem for any of these theories. If we allow the theory to determine what the fundamental properties are, there is no special quantum problem of indeterminacy. The shape of the wave function is never indeterminate, nor are the positions of particles in Bohm's theory.

GRW and Bohm's theory avoid Bell's theorem by denying the locality assumption. In chapter 5 Lewis gives a clear and intuitive explanation of how non-local causation arises in each theory. He shows that this non-locality is incompatible with the conventionality of simultaneity standardly taken to be part of special relativity, noting that GRW and Bohm's theory could still be empirically adequate if they posited an absolute standard of simultaneity. The many-worlds theory is judged to be superior on this score (compatibility with special relativity) since neither non-local causation nor an absolute standard of simultaneity are needed. Lewis also briefly sketches three other proposals for local quantum theories: Tumulka's relativistic version of GRW with a flash ontology, the transactional interpretation, and a retrocausal hidden variable approach. The latter two options involve backwards causation, a radical idea that Lewis brings up at a number of points in the book.

In Chapter 6, entitled "Determinism," Lewis considers how quantum mechanics may be relevant to philosophical debates about free will and whether the many-worlds theory implies that we are all immortal. But, his primary concern in the chapter is the status of probabilities in the many-worlds theory. This has been a popular topic of recent work in the philosophy of physics and for good reason: (i) it is important, since the viability of the many-worlds theory hinges on its ability to reproduce the standard probabilistic predictions of quantum mechanics, and (ii) it cannot be resolved by the standard methods of physics (philosophical thought is necessary), as is evidenced by Lewis's discussion of the supervenience of the mental on the physical, self-locating uncertainty, personal identity, and the foundations of decision theory.

Lewis discusses whether we can make sense of someone being uncertain about the outcome of a future quantum experiment in the many-worlds theory and, if we can, why the probabilities which quantify this uncertainty should be those generated by the standard quantum mechanical recipe. He focuses on a decision-theoretic derivation originally proposed by David Deutsch and developed by David Wallace. Lewis does not give the details of Wallace's derivation, but he does challenge its assumptions by explaining how they conflict with an intuitive alternative assignment of probabilities based on counting the number of branches (worlds) in which a particular outcome occurs. Lewis acknowledges a problem for the counting strategy -- the number of branches in which a given outcome occurs is not well-defined because branches have fuzzy boundaries (like clouds) -- but suggests that such a strategy may be salvageable if the proportion of branches in which a certain outcome occurs is well-defined. (There may be no determinate fact about the number of rivers that flow eastward and yet it may still be true that the proportion of rivers that flow eastward, as opposed to westward, is one half.)

As far as I'm aware, this is a novel defense of the branch-counting strategy and it is one that would be forceful if the suggestion about proportions being well-defined is true. However, I don't think it is. If the number of branches with a given outcome is generally not well-defined, I don't see how the proportion can be. Suppose a two-outcome quantum experiment has possible outcomes A and B and that, at least momentarily, the proportion of branches on which A occurs is equal to the proportion on which B occurs. Lewis then asks us to consider performing another similar two-outcome measurement with outcomes C and D only if the first outcome was A, concluding that after this second experiment two-thirds of the branches have outcome A recorded for the first experiment. To get this result, we must not merely assume that the second experiment splits the A branches into an equal proportion of C branches and D branches, but that the second experiment (on average) splits each A branch in two. This is untenable. Generic quantum measurements (and naturally occurring measurement-like processes) are such that each branch is taken to an indeterminate number of branches. Because the number of A branches is multiplied by an indeterminate number, if there were initially as many A branches as B branches there are now indeterminately more. The proportion is not well-defined. Although this problem was illustrated here at the point when the second measurement was performed, it will arise whenever a measurement-like process occurs on the A branches but not the B branches (or vice versa).

Because the quantum wave function is most straightforwardly understood as living on an extremely high-dimensional space, some have argued that quantum mechanics forces us to revise our intuitive impression that the world around us has three spatial dimensions. Over the last couple decades there has been a very fruitful discussion of this possibility among those interested in the metaphysics of quantum mechanics. In chapter 7 Lewis gives a brisk survey of the major perspectives in this ongoing debate, which include accepting a high-dimensional reality, adding more to reality beyond the wave function, and reconsidering the nature of the wave function.

Because of the existence of entanglement, you cannot generally specify the state of a quantum system by assigning states to each of its parts. This holism is a novel feature of quantum mechanics as compared to older physical theories and the metaphysics built off of them. In chapter 8 Lewis explains the general case for holism and how it arises in each interpretation. He also examines two arguments that there are no individuals in quantum mechanics. The first is Schaffer's argument that if the parts do not determine the state of the whole but the whole does determine the state of the parts, then the whole is more fundamental -- which in this case suggests the universe is more fundamental than the particles in it. The second argument is that because quantum particles in symmetric states are indiscernible, they are not separate entities at all. This chapter is a nice illustration of how quantum mechanics "reshapes metaphysical debates in surprising, empirically informed ways." (p. xi)

In the final chapter Lewis emphasizes that the way our classical metaphysics must be revised in light of quantum mechanics depends on which version of the theory is correct. At the moment, "very little can be concluded unconditionally on the basis of quantum mechanics . . . The best we can say is that not everything in our received classical worldview can be right." (p. 182) Which versions of quantum mechanics are tenable and what conditional metaphysical consequences can be derived from them are both matters of intense current debate. Lewis's book is an excellent introduction to this debate. It may be frustratingly inconclusive to those who want to take quick lessons from quantum mechanics, but I hope it is inspiring to those looking for places to apply their philosophical efforts.