Questions of Phenomenology: Language, Alterity, Temporality, Finitude

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Francoise Dastur, Questions of Phenomenology: Language, Alterity, Temporality, Finitude, Robert Vallier (tr.), Fordham University Press, 2017, 249pp., $32.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823233748.

Reviewed by Janet Donohoe, University of West Georgia


This collection of essays written between 1989 and 2000 provides a valuable glimpse into Dastur's influences, consistent issues of investigation, and persistent questions. Billed as focusing more on the philosophical problems that unite phenomenological thinkers than on the thinkers themselves, the sixteen essays contribute to four sets of themes. Ranging from language and logic through self and other, temporality and history to finitude and mortality, the themes are addressed through analyses of Husserl, Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, Levinas, Gadamer, and Ricoeur, as well as other somewhat less prominent phenomenologists. The aim is to highlight the ongoing dialogue between these thinkers through their works, thereby revealing their disagreements and the limits of the phenomenological method. Dastur participates fully in the dialogues she is outlining. Her selection of the themes around which to organize the essays is emblematic of her view of the central figures and their dialogues with each other. She characterizes their thought in such a way that she facilitates each dialogue and our entry into it.

The opening section on language and logic focuses, not surprisingly, on Husserl's Logical Investigations, and on ways that text both influences, and is challenged by, Heidegger. After careful explication, each chapter ends with a questioning analysis that highlights the limits of phenomenological investigation. One such query is whether particular languages, such as Chinese, challenge the Husserlian-Heideggerian emphasis on the logico-ontological structure of a predicative proposition. The Husserlian idea of a pre-predicative passive experience is confronted with a Heideggerian "transcendent" openness to the world, highlighting the Heideggerian shift from phenomenology to hermeneutics. The question becomes how the intuitionism of phenomenology can be aligned with the existential structure of understanding within hermeneutics. We are not always left with a conundrum. On occasion, as in chapter three, there is the sketch of an answer: Heidegger teaches us "to listen to the speech that orders all saying and all seeing, which have meaning and efficacy only in relation to the originary engagement in which we have always already staked our being" (53).

Section two is organized around the problem of the self and the other. Broadening the scope beyond Husserl and Heidegger, Dastur includes Levinas, Ricoeur, and Boss. In the first chapter in this section, Dastur elaborates upon Husserl's attention to intersubjectivity. Like so many other theorists, however, she focuses on Husserl's egological approach and ignores, to the detriment of her explanation, Husserl's later lifeworld approach to the reductions. In the next chapter, she poses the question of whether Husserl can be understood to claim that the "transcendental ego constitute[s] a sphere that is absolutely closed off to time and to the other?" (70). This is a limit-problem that she takes up through Husserl's later work on temporality where she in fact acknowledges that Husserl understands subjectivity as "essentially intersubjectivity in virtue of its flowing -- that is temporal -- character" (74).

Dastur draws attention to the issues that Heidegger raises for Husserlian phenomenology, namely questions about the meaning of the absolute ego as opposed to the psychical ego or the mode of being for an absolute ego. This encourages us to focus on how Heidegger is deeply indebted to Husserl, but also on what makes Heidegger so very different that he serves as an inspiration to those who come after. Dastur develops of this dialogue through Levinas on the one hand, who stresses radical alterity and priority of the other, and Merleau-Ponty and Ricoeur on the other hand who identify alterity as already constitutive of the self. This dichotomy, of course, traces back to the originary tension between Heidegger and Husserl on this count.

Temporality provides the point of contact for the third section. Initially tracing Merleau-Ponty's analysis of time as neither realist nor idealist, Dastur argues that Merleau-Ponty develops time-consciousness as the structural identity of subjectivity and temporality, thereby situating him between Husserl and Heidegger. He develops an idea of the subject as ek-static rather than synthetic, preserving a privileged position for the living present à la Husserl while seeing that present as originarily open to past and future à la Heidegger. Time is viewed neither as a reality nor as an idea, but as transitory and "processual" (117). Dastur does not limit Merleau-Ponty's mediating position to temporality. She sees his theory of time as merely a prime example of his more general role in unifying the phenomenology of Husserl and Heidegger into a "movement."

She explores the middle ground further with respect to notions of the event and of history, arguing that Heidegger's consideration of possibility as a structure of existence is already prepared by Husserl's understanding of consciousness as inclusive of potentialities in the actualities intended. For Husserl, the constitutive act entails expectation of the currently obscured far side of an object, just as for Heidegger existence is essentially in the mode of anticipation of one's own being-towards-death, i.e., expectation. Dastur argues that the anticipatory element of Husserl's intentionality and Heidegger's existential analysis could yield a phenomenology of surprise that escapes mastery through excess.

This section ends with two chapters on history, moving from Hegel through Husserl, Heidegger and finally to Gadamer and Ricoeur to develop an idea of narrative and historical hermeneutics that resists any totalizing account, such as Hegelian Absolute Knowledge or conventional epistemology. Tracing the temporal dimension of truth from Hegel through the Husserlian idea of truth that generates a history, to the Heideggerian sense that truth is relative to the human, Dastur underscores the tension between Husserl and Heidegger vis-à-vis the facticity of human existence and what she sees as the Husserlian commitment to a transcendental subject. Ultimately, she is interested in what escapes the subject's mastery in openness to the plurality of history. The explanation of Gadamer and Ricoeur furthers this disruption of a Hegelian Absolute through the development of the historical hermeneutic. Gadamer and Ricoeur show that experience is "not of the order of knowledge" and is not to be confused with positive scientific experimentation "precisely because it is not an ontic experience of this or that and because it cannot in essence be experience of the repeatable or of the same thing" (143). Instead, experience is characterized by the openness to a future that resists mastery in that it belongs to the historically affected consciousness and human finitude.

The final section is on finitude and morality. Dastur is concerned to show the phenomenological confrontation with death, as developed by Eugen Fink and Jan Patočka. She sees this as unique and fruitful since death is certainly a phenomenological limit. In the first chapter of this section, we are treated to Patočka's struggle with the differences between Husserl and Heidegger with respect to the question of human existence, followed by two chapters on the complexities of the question of finitude as taken up by Patočka and Fink, respectively. For Dastur, Patočka is the philosopher who clearly understood that Heidegger's analytic of Dasein reveals a "concrete" philosophy explored through the "authentic openness to factual possibilities" (159) that is the existential situation of our temporality. This situates Patočka's thought thoroughly in the Heideggerian strain of a philosophy of finitude over and against the highly speculative Husserlian phenomenology that aims to understand "pure" consciousness. The final chapter focuses on the Husserlian and Heideggerian conceptions of god, providing a final note of concordance between the two. Each allows for the figure of a God, but a God that is not characterized by its eternity or its transcendence.

The volume provides a compelling view of the ongoing dialogue amongst phenomenologists with regard to fundamental questions of language, temporality, intersubjectivity, and mortality. Dastur has provided a road map through these historical figures, drawing out the connections between their ideas to make the conversation explicit. The clarity of her writing, the presentation of difficult concepts in comprehensible terms, makes this a remarkably accessible and interesting read. Perhaps in an effort to elaborate the dialogue with clarity, she has over-emphasized the degree to which Husserl relies upon a static consciousness. To avoid discussion of the lifeworld and its inherent intersubjectivity does not do justice to Husserl's complex account of the intersubjectivity at the heart of subjectivity. Dastur seems unfamiliar with much of the work that has been done on the later Husserl, leaving her to confine him to "presupposing consciousness as something ultimate" (154) without sufficiently asking the questions of the role of historicity, intersubjectivity, living present, or genetic phenomenology in the understanding of that consciousness.

It is not surprising that the themes presented here would be seen as limit cases for phenomenology, nor is it unacknowledged by the phenomenologists themselves. Limit cases are precisely those aspects of experience from which the phenomenologist can learn the most. Husserl, Heidegger and the others were deliberately working at the limits of philosophy. One might wonder why Dastur settled on precisely these important themes and not others. For instance, the problematic of world seems to show up in many of her discussions, but doesn't warrant its own independent investigation. World, lifeworld, worldhood, world horizon, flesh of the world: these concepts seem very much a theme of vital dialogue and importance for the philosophers discussed in these essays. Why would Dastur not have taken on this theme as one of the fundamentals? I am not suggesting that she should have included the theme of the world, or any other particular theme, necessarily, but Dastur has not provided any justification or explanation for why she has chosen the themes she has, so we are left to wonder.

Finally, what manifests itself as both a strength and a weakness of the volume is its breadth and range. Her explanations of philosophical positions are generally very clear and accessible, while avoiding the pitfalls of oversimplification. She does not hesitate to interject her analyses, bringing these phenomenological theories to bear on contemporary discussions. However, there is no unifying argument apart from the claim that the phenomenological movement has some consistent themes which bring the thinkers into dialogue. This can at times make the text somewhat frustrating as you move from dialogue to dialogue, theme to theme. But it also makes the book a good resource for thinking through a theme in short and efficient bits. One can read the book in whatever order one chooses, selecting those chapters that might most appeal without losing the thread of an argument. There is much of value in so many of the chapters through the explication of key phenomenological concepts, the fruitful conversation elaborated upon through these thinkers, and Dastur's own analysis that it is certainly worth reading.