Questions of Taste: The Philosophy of Wine; and, Wine and Philosophy: A Symposium on Thinking and Drinking

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Barry C. Smith (ed.), Questions of Taste: The Philosophy of Wine, Oxford University Press, 2007, 222pp., $27.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780195331462.

Fritz Allhoff (ed.), Wine and Philosophy: A Symposium on Thinking and Drinking, Wiley-Blackwell, 2008, 308pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405154314.

Reviewed by Peter Machamer, University of Pittsburgh


For those of us philosophical folk with oenophilic predilections, these books ought to have opened up new horizons on questions of taste and evaluation. Thirteen of the thirty authors represented are (or were) philosophers by profession. Some of the rest were undergraduate philosophy majors. Others are professional winemakers or wine writers.

The articles about wine written by the wine 'guys' are usually quite good. I especially recommend those by Jaime Goode (author of The Science of Wine) who appears in both volumes. He writes about wine and the brain (in Smith) and how critics (and others) experience wine (in Allhoff). Adrienne Lehrer, the linguist and author of the excellent Wine and Conversation, also appears in each book, though once with her tasting partner and husband Keith. Both she and Kent Bach (in Allhoff) write about the words of wine in some insightful ways that may open up important ways of thinking about semantics that all too often becomes too philosophically rarified. The Ophelia Deroy article (in Smith) is a particularly nicely written piece trying to reconcile science with the subjectivity of taste, as, for example, in discussing a 'closed' wine.

The papers by the philosophers are less unusual, and quite predictably focus on questions about the objectivity versus subjectivity of taste and wine as an aesthetic object (Bach, Smith, Deroy, Crane, Charters in Smith; Bender, Burnham & Skilleads, Gale, Charters, Sweeney in Allhoff). Mostly, they try to argue it's all about the wine, but often in doing so neglect the drinker and the ambiance of the environment, though Bach (in Smith) does consider the role of background knowledge in tasting. For example, no one discusses facts such as that even experienced tasters rank wines they believe to be expensive (and they are not) more highly than those they think are cheaper, or that tasting wine professionally is a most arduous and unpleasant task because the tannins dehydrate the mouth to the point where your teeth hurt. Some actually try to come to grips with the conscious experience or pleasure involved in wine drinking (Bach in Smith; Dilworth in Allhoff), and sometimes argue that better wine means better pleasure -- shades of John Stuart Mill and his satisfied pig. Roger Scruton (in Smith) does take up intoxication, even while he argues the strange claim that "Tastes belong with smells and sounds in the ontological category of secondary objects" (Smith, 15). He also seems to disapprove of intoxication.

There is a historical-cultural section in Allhoff that provides some fun, and in a later section Orley Ashenfelter, Richard Quandt and George Taber analyze the famous French versus American Paris tasting of 1976. Ashenfelter, a Princeton economist, may be known to some for having started a newsletter, Liquid Assets, focusing on correlating harvest dates with auction prices -- which was a really objective analysis. Two winemakers write in the Allhoff volume, Warren Winiarski and Randall Graham. Winiarski searches for the role of tradition in wine making. I recall visiting his Stag's Leap Wine Cellars operation many years back, and finding huge numbers of egg cartons stacked against the wall. He used the egg whites for fining and would sell the yolks to a local bakery. Graham tries to find the 'soul' in wine. Yet those who are familiar with Graham's Bonny Doon newsletter will miss the devilish humor that he exhibits in his writings there. I do not understand why Allhoff reproduced Matt Kramer's chapter from his 1990 Burgundy book, since there have appeared many more interesting articles and books on the concept of terroir. Kramer is a good, no nonsense wine writer, but talking about the influence of the soil and its location does cry out for some science.

Nonetheless these two volumes are highly recommended for those who like to read about wine as well as drink it. The Allhoff book is part of the 'Epicurean Trilogy' -- the others being Beer and Philosophy and Food and Philosophy. The authors in both volumes are to be congratulated for expanding the philosophical domain of value inquiry in a direction that ought to be much applauded. They explore many truly fascinating aspects of wine, wine tasting, wine talking and wine thinking. Yet no one had the audacity to argue that drinking wine is a moral good and contributes to virtue, that the categorical imperative applies to wine drinking, or that wine drinking is a human capability that needs to rise above a certain threshold in order for a person to flourish! Perhaps philosophically inclined wine drinkers are timorous types?