Quiet Powers of the Possible: Interviews in Contemporary French Phenomenology

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Tarek R. Dika and W. Chris Hackett (eds.), Quiet Powers of the Possible: Interviews in Contemporary French Phenomenology, Fordham University Press, 2016, 265pp., $32.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823264728.

Reviewed by Ian James, Downing College, University of Cambridge


This book represents an important and invaluable contribution to the Anglophone reception of recent and contemporary French phenomenology. Across ten interviews the volume offers an introduction to the field as it currently stands and as it has developed over the last thirty years or so. It also offers a philosophical exploration of this development, its key moments, questions and concerns. The list of thinkers interviewed includes Jean-François Courtine, Jean-Luc Marion, Claude Romano, Jocelyn Benoist, Michel Henry (posthumously), Renaud Barbaras, Françoise Dastur and Jean-Louis Chrétien. Despite this wide range of thinkers and the potentially disparate set of questions with which they engage, the volume does address a central argument, namely, as the editors put it in their helpful introduction, the thesis that: 'French phenomenology has been nothing if not committed to developing an expanded concept of reason' (1). Across the diverse range of fundamental phenomenological questions and problems that are raised in the interviews the questioning of the 'status of reason' does indeed emerge as a consistent concern which broadly defines contemporary French phenomenology.

Despite this, however, one is struck by the diversity of approaches and the differences or oppositions which separate these thinkers from one another. Courtine, in an interview which gives an overview of the historical context of recent developments, puts it very helpfully when he notes that: 'almost all of the differences between the multiple versions of this "new French phenomenology" hinge on how concepts like the given, pure givenness, the event, or even more, the Ereignis are to be defined' (30). Some of these differences are very stark indeed and give rise to bodies of thought or philosophical positions that are opposed to each other and that give very divergent images of what, in the fundamentals of its approach, phenomenology actually is as way of thinking. Not surprisingly this sense of difference or divergence is most clearly marked in questions related to the so-called 'theological turn' within phenomenology as polemically identified by Dominique Janicaud in his 1991 work Le Tournant théologique de la phénoménologie française. Although slightly reductive perhaps, it is arguable that, within this divergent field, two distinct tendencies emerge. The first tendency takes a strong interest in phenomena that were traditionally not the central concern of classical phenomenology, for instance, those of revelation or liturgical, sacred and religious experience and thereby exemplifies the theological turn that Janicaud identified. The second tendency has concerned itself with questions concerning structure and logic, both of language and of the phenomenal world itself, and has therefore aligned itself more with profane worldly experience in a way which would open out more onto scientific rather than theological concerns and which has led some French phenomenologists presented here into direct engagements with the analytical tradition. The respective positions of Marion and Romano can perhaps best be called upon in order to exemplify the philosophical stakes of these two distinct tendencies.

Marion, of course, is best known for his radical reading of the problematic of 'givenness' and of the phenomenological reduction in Husserlian and Heideggerian thought (most notably in works such as Réduction et Donation (1989) and Étant donné (1997)). He is also known for his description of 'saturated' phenomena and for the paradigmatic status he confers on such phenomena in relation to phenomenality in general. For Marion the saturated phenomenon is characterized by a form of absolute givenness to perception which is in excess of any and all delimiting or determinate horizon. It is an entirely unconditioned phenomenon which is neither limited by the directedness of an intentional consciousness nor grounded in the constitutive operations of a transcendental ego. The saturated phenomenon is, for Marion, paradigmatic or exemplary insofar as he clearly states, in Étant donné for instance, that it 'establishes the truth of all phenomenality'.

In the interview published here Marion returns to this fundamental thematic by way of the motif of an originary or 'ur'-phenomenality and its excess over any operation of phenomenological constitution or instance of intuition. 'The Urphänomen', he notes, 'is not constituted. So the question of presence is not a question of intuition' (48). In excess of intuition, of intentional directedness, and therefore of worldly horizonality, the presencing of this originary givenness or phenomenality is, for Marion, a presencing unconditioned by any a priori or by any transcendental instance. Marion is clear on this point and on the fact that it is the most significant element of his contribution to phenomenology in general: 'there is no a priori, not even the passive a priori, nor that of the transcendental 'I', nor yet of the empirical self. This is a very strong move. I think I made this point with givenness' (54). As I suggested in The New French Philosophy this 'very strong move' shifts Marion's thinking beyond the orbit of the post-Kantian legacy of transcendental constitution allowing it to be placed comparatively alongside other, very different, contemporary critiques of the Kantian transcendental such as that of Quentin Meillassoux. And yet the outcome of Marion's thinking could not be more different from that of Meillassoux's thought which aligns itself so explicitly with mathematics and to a certain degree with science. Marion's insistence that 'If there is no a priori, there is no limit. The sky is the limit, not even the sky' (56) allows him to confer a philosophical dignity and seriousness on such phenomena as revelation and even, in his more recent work, to elevate the status of revelation to a position of exemplarity in relation to phenomenality in general. For those less inclined to confer such a high degree of philosophical dignity, seriousness and centrality on specific modalities of religious experience, the stripping away of horizonality, constitutive conditioning and worldly context from phenomenal appearance may be troubling even if, unlike Janicaud, they are ready to concede the originality and methodological innovation of Marion's recasting of phenomenological givenness.

Romano's innovation within phenomenology could not, in many respects, be more different from that of Marion. Where the latter situates the excessive un-conditionality of the saturated phenomenon as the most fundamental dimension of appearance, Romano insists on maintaining, or even intensifying, the contextual horizons that structure worldly manifestation, although, crucially and decisively, he too argues that such horizons are anterior to the constitutive operations of subjective and intersubjective consciousness. One of the most important arguments he makes is that there is no world without what he calls a 'logic of world': 'there is a Weltlogik, a "logic of the world" -- a logic of the world as phenomenal world -- and the unconditioned necessities in which this "logic" is rooted are anterior to all the conventions that we can adopt about them' (69-70). So, although he also does, like Marion, affirm the 'unconditioned necessities' of appearance, Romano's position is decisively different insofar as it does not jettison worldly horizonality from phenomenal appearance. Rather it intensifies its status or importance whilst (or indeed by) insisting that such horizonality is not an operation of transcendental or (inter-)subjective constitution but a quality of the structure of world as world. Romano thereby maintains what many might consider fundamental to phenomenology as such, namely the idea that phenomena always show themselves against the backdrop, or within the context of, a horizon of meaningfulness. On this he is very explicit: 'Nothing can be a perception in isolation. Perception has an intrinsically holistic nature' (80). Marion's central insistence on a fundamental phenomenality in excess of all horizonal context is opposed by Romano with the argument that 'An experience is a perception only if it is integrated without hiatus into all of perception, which is to say it if it presents a structural cohesion with all other perceptions within this whole' (80). This emphasis on a logic of the world and its interrelated, structural cohesion directs the fundamental concern of phenomenology away from hyper-subjective experiences such as revelation and towards the factuality of the world and its existence prior to our all too human horizons of language, discourse or other symbolic and categorial modes. For Romano, then, the world appears according to 'a material synthetic a priori' and a 'logos immanent to the sensible'.

Interestingly Romano's formulations here to a degree echo Georges Canguilhem's thinking in the 1966 essay 'New Knowledge of Life' where he refers to a fundamental meaningfulness inscribed within (living) matter which could be characterised as 'an objective a priori' and as a 'properly material a priori'. The shifting of the a priori from the structures of transcendental subjectivity to a material dimension of existence which precedes or is anterior to those structures is precisely what allows Romano's thinking to be opened out onto scientific and realist thought and to be usefully compared with the biological philosophy of figure such as Canguilhem, who dominated the mid-twentieth century tradition of French historical epistemology. It marks a clear alternative route for contemporary French phenomenology away from the theological and towards science, where an expanded concept of reason finds its focus not on an unconditioned 'givenness' but rather on a structural and relational account of fundamental, sensible and material experience. For Romano the renewed rationality offered by phenomenology will be one 'that begins from the level of our sensible, corporeal, pre-intellectual, and pre-linguistic openness to the world, of which reason in the narrow sense, the reason of the intellect and inferential reason, is the continuation' (90).

One can see across the interviews given in this volume the way in which those thinkers who have a leaning towards theology and those who have engaged more with convergences between phenomenology and the tradition of analytic philosophy are marked by the differences highlighted in relation to Marion and Romano. Thus a thinker such as Benoist will say quite clearly that: 'I do not believe in "givenness" as the ultimate figure of the absoluteness of the phenomenological' (105). By the same token Jean-Yves Lacoste in his comments on the experience of liturgy having a kind of a priori quality in and of itself will insist (as Marion does in relation to the event of the saturated phenomenon (54)) that 'we only have an a posteriori knowledge of the a priori' (189).

A figure who might challenge or be situated beyond the terms of the two tendencies outlined here is Henry, whose contribution is composed posthumously from a variety of interviews he gave during his lifetime. In many ways, Henry is no longer a contemporary figure, given that his phenomenology began to be most decisively elaborated in the early 1960s with the publication of L'Essence de la manifestation (1963). Yet his relevance for the developments within French phenomenology that this volume charts has in no way diminished (he was a decisive influence of Marion for instance). Henry's phenomenology of life has as its central argument that 'To live is to experience oneself and nothing else' and that the 'phenomenology of this pure experience of oneself is an original affectivity, a pure "pathos" that no distance separates from oneself' (120). This characterization of life as immanent auto-affectivity suspends or is anterior to worldly horizonality, intentional directedness and the constitutive operations of the transcendental ego (thus prefiguring Marion's account of givenness). At the same time it affirms a primordial materiality which is the medium of self-affection which makes corporeal sense experience of the world possible (thus prefiguring the central concern of Romano). Henry's phenomenology of life opens out both onto his theological concerns or religious commitments and onto the possibility of aligning phenomenology with biological and scientific thought (as the reference to the work of Hans Jonas in Renaud Barabras' interview on 'The Phenomenology of Life' makes clear). The importance of Henry for post-phenomenological thinkers such as François Laruelle who engage very closely with both scientific and theological thematics and problems is highly significant in this regard.

There is a great deal of richness, detail and complex discussion contained in these interviews which cannot be treated within the space of a short review. Suffice to say that, beyond the now dated polemics of Janicaud's discourse on the 'theological turn' within French phenomenology, this volume testifies to the ongoing importance of this tradition as a whole and to both its contemporary diversity and future potential. As such Quiet Powers of the Possible deserves to be received as an indispensable contribution to the field and as a significant interrogation into the powers and possibilities of phenomenology's expanded account of reason.