Quine and Davidson on Language, Thought and Reality

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Glock, Hans-Johann, Quine and Davidson on Language, Thought and Reality, Cambridge, 2003, 330pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521821800.

Reviewed by Cory Juhl , University of Texas, Austin


Glock’s most recent book is a critical examination of the views of Quine and Davidson. One of the novel features of the book that will prove helpful to most readers is Glock’s comparative treatment of the two. Glock not only thoroughly articulates their views, he also points out significant differences between their basic assumptions and between the goals driving their various projects. For example, Glock compares Quine’s ’radical translation’ project with Davidson’s ’radical interpretation’ project, pointing out interesting differences in assumptions and purposes. Another unusual feature of the book is that Glock is himself fundamentally at odds with both Quine and Davidson, and holds views that are broadly Witttgensteinian. Thus, unlike most extant books on Quine and Davidson, Glock’s strives to make manifest various weaknesses of their arguments and views, rather than to show how they can be salvaged from what would appear to be devastating criticisms. However, while fundamentally critical, Glock’s book is not particularly polemical. He clearly and forcefully presents the views that he criticizes and defends positions of his protagonists from criticisms that he takes to be off-target or unfair.

Glock, like Wittgenstein, shares many conclusions with Quine and Davidson. In particular Glock notes their shared anti-Cartesianism and anti-’Platonism’. The fundamental disagreement that Glock has with them is their scientism or ’naturalism’. Glock thinks that the outlooks of Quine and Davidson are both driven at a fundamental level by a desire to assimilate semantic phenomena to physical phenomena, a project that Glock believes is doomed to failure. Throughout the book Glock provides brief characterizations of his own positive views, including deflationism about truth and ontology, and anti-reductionism with respect to semantic concepts.

Sprinkled throughout the book are the occasional humorous passages. Among the more noteworthy is this one, from early on in the book: “On some points, I shall argue, Quine and Davidson are simply wrong. This creates a problem. Being wrong is the fate of lesser mortals. Great philosophers instead suffer the indignity of being constantly misunderstood. In this time-honoured tradition, Quine, Davidson and their followers occasionally seem to think that any radical criticism must be based on misunderstanding. The risk of misinterpretation is real. But part of the blame must lie with our protagonists. They have many philosophical virtues. Yet excessive sensitivity to tensions in their own work, whether they be synchronic inconsistencies or diachronic changes of mind, is not one of them” (5). For this reason Glock focuses on the original statements, which are straightforward and provocative, and later deal with subsequent modifications (6).

Glock calls their shared view ’logical pragmatism’, emphasizing the joint influence of logical positivism and pragmatism. One noteworthy difference between Quine and Davidson that Glock mentions is that Davidson does not accept Quine’s assimilation of epistemology to ’physiological psychology’. Rather, Davidson thinks that there is a fundamental difference between reason-based explanation and other causal explanations (32).

The book deals in great detail with a wide range of issues and is dense with argument. It will be impossible to summarize in this review the dialectics of even a single chapter. Instead I will give some idea of Glock’s treatment of a few issues that are probably of particular interest to a fairly broad philosophical audience: chapter two on ontology, chapter three on analyticity, and chapters five through eight on issues having to do with Quine’s indeterminacy of translation, Davidson’s ’radical interpretation’, and Davidson’s truth-theoretic treatment of meaning.

Concerning Quine’s ontological views, Glock argues that any adequate notion of ’ontological commitment’ is intensional. Glock reviews attempts by Quine to come up with extensional versions, but one of these leads to no commitments for false theories, and other variants have the consequence that any false existential claim, such as the existence of ether, commits one to Homeric gods and phlogiston. Appeal to ’the most parsimonious translation’ reintroduces intensional notions (49). Next Glock argues that Quine’s claims about singular terms and their failure to generate ontological commitments are unpersuasive. One main Quinean argument appeals to the fact that claims involving singular terms are ’paraphrasable’ via sentences not involving such terms. But Glock notes that paraphrasability in other terms does not entail eliminability. Further, the purported paraphrases may not be explicable in the absence of singular terms. The very predicate ’Pegasizes’ seems inexplicable without appeal to the term ’Pegasus’ (54). There is much else in this very interesting chapter, including the final section, where Glock presents some of his own ’deflationary’ views about ontology. Glock ends this chapter by concluding that there is ’… an incoherence in Quine’s position. On the one hand, his naturalism construes philosophical problems of existence as factual or internal. On the other hand, his extensionalism repudiates the answers which, on this construal, are appropriate, because of metaphysical scruples for which he has left no room’ (70). Glock argues that Quine explicitly takes his ontological work to be a natural extension of the scientific ’limning of reality’. But Quine’s actual work, on closer examination, appears to place . priori constraints on what science can acceptably countenance.

Analyticity is the focus of Glock’s third chapter. Glock convincingly argues that Quine cannot show that intensional notions are obscure without appeal to the indeterminacy-of-translation arguments, which arguments Glock spends a great deal of time on in later chapters. His own positive account of analyticity is not obviously successful, although it is not obviously unsuccessful, either. Glock’s proposed definition is ’a sentence s expresses an analytic proposition =: if a speaker sincerely denies or rejects s, this shows either that x fails to understand s or that x is deliberately employing s in a novel sense’. One potential difficulty for Glock’s proposal is that if analyticity is to play the sort of epistemic role that many have wanted it to play, it is not obvious that his definition will work. It may be, for example, that anyone who rejects ’Santa lives at the North Pole’ fails to understand the sentence as standardly employed, but it is nevertheless false that Santa lives at the North Pole. More fundamentally, the justification of the inference from ’belief or acceptance is criterial for understanding of s’ to ’s is true’ or ’s is known to be true by those who understand s’ is not completely clear, at least to this reader. On the other hand, if we don’t care whether analytic sentences are readily known to be true . priori, then Glock’s sort of definition may supply such a notion. Although the second disjunct in effect appeals to meanings, and hence the definition is ’circular’, this is not an objection that Glock will worry about at this stage of the dialectic, since by this time Glock has argued at length that unless indeterminacy of translation is genuine and thereby shows that such notions as meaning are obscure, the circularity involved is not vicious.

Glock argues later at length that Quine’s arguments for the indeterminacy of translation fail. The gist of a very helpful and illuminating discussion is that ’Quine’s method of translation cannot yield even the meager results it is supposed to, without tacitly smuggling in either a prior understanding of the natives, or hermeneutical methods and intensional notions which he disowns’ (175). A simple yet powerful point along these lines is that the ’radical translator’ must take for granted that the natives are trying to cooperate with the translator, to teach him the language, applying terms in paradigmatic situations, and so on. An amusing story Glock recounts has it that the early French translator Labillardiere pressed natives for numerals for numbers higher than twenty. The expletives that he received in reply were taken to be those numerals. Glock thinks that ’the only alternative to taking this kind of understanding for granted is to assume that the native knows that the radical translator is trying to establish the stimulus-meaning of her words. For Quinean translation to work, the natives had better read a translation of Word and Object!’ (179)

Glock argues that once we make use of common human tendencies and reactions, terms such as ’gavagai’ acquire determinate translations. Quine’s substitute for meanings, ’stimulus meanings’, which involve nerve-ending stimulations, is castigated for its lack of publicity. We generally don’t know, for example, whether others have the same types of neural firings in similar environmental circumstances. And if we don’t, such facts are irrelevant to meanings. Davidson improves the picture somewhat, Glock thinks, by appealing to middle-sized dry goods as the common data, but even so Davidson slips into describing the data in ’physicalistic’ terms, thereby violating the requirement that Quine and Davidson both lay down for acceptable views, that they appeal to data that are readily known in common. Glock points out that we quite often don’t share common knowledge of our environments as characterized in physicalist terms. For example, we can see the anger in someone’s expression without being able to give a physical description of the relations between parts of the face. Worse, Davidson eventually regresses to an even less plausible view by taking as basic a notion of ’preferring to be true’ between sentences. Unlike the case of assent and dissent, it is not even prima facie plausible that there are characteristic behaviors associated with ’preferring to be true’.

The final chapters of the book deal mostly with Davidson. Glock presses well-known worries about whether Davidson’s truth-conditional accounts of meaning can solve the ’extensionality problem’. Much of this discussion will be familiar to both friends and foes of Davidson, but Glock’s overviews are illuminating and penetrating. While a convinced Davidsonian will probably not be budged, those not already convinced will come away thanking Glock for saving them the trouble of pursuing what would appear to be a doomed project. Davidson’s principles of charity, as constitutive of correct interpretation, come under fire as well. Davidson’s principles suggest that ’radical interpretation starts by projecting all of our beliefs on to the natives, allowing for the ascription of error only as a second step’ (196). Glock points out that ’It is glaringly obvious that this is not how we interpret from scratch. The Spanish conquistadors … [and others] … did not start out on the assumption that the natives shared all of their beliefs, including … that ships can sail against the wind, or that infectious diseases are caused by micro-organisms … ’ (196). Glock considers Grandy’s substitute ’principle of humanity’, but thinks that what the radical translator must ultimately appeal to is ’a framework of shared cognitive capacities and conative propensities (needs, emotions, attitudes)’ (197).

In the final chapter Glock deals with, among other issues, the question whether animals can have beliefs. Glock thinks that some of Davidson’s arguments have some merit, but that the argument that Davidson thinks is most compelling (that in order to have beliefs one must have the concept of belief) is actually without merit. Even convinced Davidsonians will read the latter half of the book with interest, if only to see a particularly clear and thorough attempt at dismantling various central aspects of the Davidsonian framework. Glock clearly agrees with much in Davidson. Yet Glock believes that Davidson goes astray, like Quine, due to scientistic tendencies.

A neat summary of the main conclusions that Glock reaches is at the end of the introduction. There he explains that his book “rehabilitates the idea that there is a qualitative difference between science, which is concerned with empirical facts, and philosophy, which is concerned with conceptual issues and hence . priori. It also counts against those numerous and highly influential forms of naturalism which insist that human behavior consists au fond of nothing but sounds and movements, or that all facts are (reducible to) physical facts. I do not purport to refute this kind of naturalism. But I hope to show that it finds no succour in Quine and Davidson. Rightly understood, some of their claims even militate against such a position. And although they subscribe to it in many respects, they do not provide sound arguments in its favour. In particular, the flight from intensions, the indeterminacy thesis included, presupposes rather than demonstrates that intensional discourse is obscure and non-factual” (11).

Glock’s book is one that every philosopher should have on his or her shelf, and most will find it an enjoyable and illuminating work. Glock tells us that the book is geared ’mainly to graduate students and professionals’ (6). It is admirably clear, insightful and provides critical overviews of the most important arguments of two of the most influential philosophers of the twentieth century, from the point of view of a critic rather than a sympathizer. There is something valuable here for everyone, whether friend or foe of Quine or Davidson.