Quine, New Foundations, and the Philosophy of Set Theory

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Sean Morris, Quine, New Foundations, and the Philosophy of Set Theory, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 209pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107152502.

Reviewed by Gary Kemp, University of Glasgow


Sean Morris' book is on a topic long overdue for discussion. In many ways, Quine's sophisticated attitude towards set theory and mathematics generally is central to his philosophy. The most relevant texts are by now venerable, if not yet antique: 'New Foundations for Mathematical Logic' appeared in 1937, and Set Theory and Its Logic in 1963 (set theory proper dates from Cantor in 1870s). Yet -- though arguably this attitude has received its share of mathematical attention -- it has not received the sustained and patient philosophical attention that Morris gives it. It is true that some philosophers have expressed the opinion -- perhaps the prevailing opinion amongst philosophers who have considered the question in the first place -- that the system presented in New Foundations is too artificial, too ad hoc to regard as a legitimate challenger to Zermelo's set theory and its descendants (an opinion expressed by Boolos), or to Type Theory (an opinion expressed by Russell himself). And further, unlike those two examples, it cannot seriously be proposed as laying bare the essence of sethood. Such opinions are the work of a page or two, but Morris devotes 194 pages to a meticulous argument to the contrary. It is not that New Foundations (NF) defeats Type Theory -- or Zermelo's set theory (Z), Zermelo-Frankael's (ZF), or ZF with the Axiom of Choice (ZFC) -- or that despite appearances NF actually reveals the essence of set. Rather, what Morris argues is that mathematically and philosophically the matter is a draw. The right attitude, at least for anyone who does not subscribe to an extravagant metaphysics, is one of pluralism, of letting many flowers bloom. The idea that there is an essence of set to be discovered is not tenable. One's attitude towards the concept of set should rather be one of explication, not conceptual analysis or analysis of the things themselves. As with ontology generally, Quine does not think that there is any deeper insight than that provided by science itself, and as is often so, the science in this quarter is just unsettled, a state of affairs that is not guaranteed to be temporary.

1. The book is not a survey of set theory. For example, it touches only in passing on the theory of von Neumann, Bernays and Gödel (NBG), or on the very different perspective afforded by the theory of Peter Aczel. But the alternatives to NF it does consider in some depth -- Type Theory and ZF -- represent two dominant theories of the 20th century, theories to which Quine's views were largely a response. (NBG did receive sustained attention from Quine in his Mathematical Logic and Set Theory and Its Logic; and Morris suggests that Quine's views make it very likely that he would accept Aczel's theory as another bloom-worthy flower).

It is divided into three parts. Part I ('Set Theory's Beginnings') contains three chapters: one on Cantor; one on the discovery and responses by Cantor, Russell and Zermelo to the paradoxes; and one on some of the technical details of Quine's 'New Foundations'. Part II ('Quine, Set Theory, and Philosophy') contains two chapters: one introducing Quine's philosophy of set theory via a narrative beginning with Quine's The Logic of Sequences (PhD dissertation, 1932) and A System of Logistic (1934), culminating in 'New Foundations for Mathematical Logic'; the other explaining Quine's notion of explication and its envisaged role in set theory and in mathematics generally (making pointed use of Set Theory and Its Logic). Part III ('New Foundations and the Philosophy of Set Theory') also contains two chapters: one critically discusses Boolos' 'The Iterative Conception of Set'; the other discusses Quine's alternative vision of set theory in general terms, after explicitly comparing NF with Z, ZF and ZFC.

The first two chapters offer a concise, readable exposition of Cantor, Russell and Zermelo, with just enough mathematical and set-theoretic detail to convey the situation represented by Russell's paradox (the set of all sets which are not members of themselves), Burali-Forti's paradox (the ordinal of the collection of all ordinals) and Cantor's paradox (the power set of the universe, which seems to be bigger than universe itself). Russell and Zermelo swiftly came to the realisation that a set theory must serve two contesting masters: On the one hand, it must somehow get round the paradoxes implicit, for example, in the naïve assumption that every condition determines a class; on the other hand, it must serve for the representation of mathematics -- number theory, the calculus and so on.

The philosophical nub of Russell 's response was perhaps his Vicious Circle Principle, which purported to rationalize his Theory of Types: entities are segregated into type-0 (individuals), type-1 (classes of individuals) . . . type-n+1 (classes of type-n items) . . . , and so on. (For Russell we must also think of each type as being ramified into orders, according to the highest type of bound variable occurring in the specification of the given class; see immediately below). Classes contain only entities of the next lower type; this rules out the Russell set, as defined by the now-nonsensical condition x ∉ x. The other paradoxes are ruled out similarly, as turning on the assumption that classes formed from a given totality may themselves be members of that very totality (the Vicious Circle Principle prohibits this). But there are drawbacks to this scheme. Not only was there neither the unique universal class nor the complement class of a given condition -- those things exist only at a given type -- there is not even a unique set of natural numbers: natural numbers exist only for each type. Russell also requires the bald assertion of an Axiom of Infinity and the Multiplicative Axiom or Axiom of Choice, or at least their conditional assertion where they are needed. (An added complication is that Russell's philosophical predilections required all this talk about 'classes' to be just a manner of speaking, as the subject-matter of the theory is actually the domain of propositional functions, which are like sets but have intensional structure; he thus positively requires the ramified theory which in turn requires an Axiom of Reducibility, which has the effect of collapsing the orders). Still, for all this reduplication and other departures from simplicity, the thing does seem to deliver mathematics.

Russell's Principles of Mathematics appeared in 1903; 'Mathematical Logic as based on the Theory of Types' in 1908, and part one of Principia Mathematica, with Whitehead, in 1910. Zermelo concurrently approached more or less the same family of problems, publishing his crucial papers in 1908, but from a more practical and less philosophical angle. Like Russell he is willing to dispense with a universal class, and accepts an Axiom of Infinity, but does not accept a type-theoretic sorting of sets. To take care of the inconsistency in naïve set theory -- the principle that any condition (predicate or one-variable open formula) specifies a class (Frege's Basic Law V) -- Zermelo's system makes the weaker claim that given any set and any condition, a subset of the set exists whose members satisfy the condition (the Axiom of Separation). In total, Zermelo's system has seven axioms plus a few definitions. Whereas Cantor characterised a set as 'any collection of elements of our thought', and Frege took his Basic Law V to characterise them as the extensions of predicates, Zermelo took his axioms to specify what a set is only as a whole, as Morris explains (pp. 46-50). To prove that every set is well-ordered Zermelo would add the Axiom of Choice; later Fraenkel would extend the theory further into the transfinite by adding the Axiom of Replacement, and others would prove things about Choice, including its relative consistency (Gödel) and its independence from the other axioms (Cohen).

Although ZFC is without the philosophically-motivated complexity of Russell's system, once again, according to Morris, its resolution of the paradoxes is not altogether satisfying. He quotes Zermelo, who accepted the 'situation that our intuitions about sets have led us astray':

There is at this point nothing left for us but to proceed in the opposite direction and, starting from set theory as it is historically given, to seek out the principles required for establishing the foundations of this mathematical discipline. In solving the problem we must, on the one hand, restrict these principles sufficiently to exclude all contradictions and, on the other, take them sufficiently wide to retain all that is valuable in this theory. (quoted at p. 49)

2. That was the scene that presented itself to Quine: 'Neither Russell nor Zermelo', writes Morris, 'relies on some preconceived notion of set beyond just the mathematical aims of the theory. Beyond this, there is no univocal conception that . . . the theory aim[s] to capture' (p. 51). The attitude -- no doubt in the ascendance since the 1960s -- that there is a conception of set that these theories disagree about, that there is a univocal essence of set, is really not sustainable, according to Morris. A more sensible attitude is that here is a notion calling for explication, in Quine's special philosophical sense (inherited largely from Carnap). The notion to be explicated is governed by some principle or conjunction of principles that cannot be forsworn but are not satisfactory as they stand, because the notion seems to invoke unwanted entities or entities one thinks are superfluous; the task is to re-interpret the notion and hence the principles in terms of entities which already have the seal of approval. A simple example Quine famously cited later (Word and Object §53) is the ordered pair. The principle to validate is 'If <x, y> = <z, w> then x=z and y=w'; the question 'What are these things, the ordered pairs?' can be answered by construing them as sets: In Kuratowski's way as {​{x}, {x, y}​}, or in Wiener's way as {​{x}, {y, Ø}​}, or in some other way. Although it is reasonable to prefer the simpler explication, what is vital is just the validation of the principle. The same goes for Natural Numbers -- the principles being Peano's Postulates -- and for the integers, rationals and reals (the case of the imaginary number i is an especially transparent example; p. 107). Sets themselves are items of last resort -- Russell's idea of construing set theory as really about propositional functions aside -- there are no further objects in terms of which to construe them, yet still the explicative attitude is broadly the same. The principles are many -- the whole of mathematics -- but the desideratum is just that with an ontology of sets, we want to make mathematics true in the simplest and most parsimonious way we can. It matters comparatively little what the sets 'are'.

Morris makes a powerful case that if the situation is as just described, then NF is no worse off than Type Theory, or than Z, ZF or ZFC. Quine points out that the Vicious Circle Principle rules too much; for example, to define the typical Yale man on the basis of average Yale grades including his own, is not illegitimate (p. 129). His strategy is to retain much of the insight animating Type Theory but to do away with inessential appurtenances, including, strictly speaking, the types themselves. NF includes just one set theoretic axiom -- the Principle of Extensionality -- plus a single set-theoretic rule or axiom schema, that of 'Stratified Comprehension': A formula φ determines a class so long as it is stratified, i.e., where any occurrences of '∈' appearing in φ are flanked by variables which can be assigned ascending types. Stratified comprehension alone leaves the status of unstratified examples undetermined, but the existence of such classes as the paradoxical {x: x ∉ x} can be disproved by reductio. It is thus 'inessential', remarks Morris, 'that the universe actually be stratified into levels. What the typing restriction does is to provide a syntactic test for which formulas actually determine classes' (p, 62, emphasis added). A test for stratification can be expressed more rigorously as a syntactical operation without actually mentioning types; the solution, so to speak, lies not in the structure of the universe of sets but in what we are allowed to say about them. No axiom of reducibility, no axiom of replacement and none of infinity is required (e.g., the existence of the infinite set {Ø, {Ø}, {​{Ø}​} . . . } is provable). On the other hand, the Zermelian Axiom of Foundation (or Regularity) is positively ruled out because the universe of NF is openly not well-founded (for example V∈V); big sets such as absolute complements and the universal set do exist. Yet it seems consistent, and like Type Theory it seems to suffice for mathematics.

The situation is more complicated if we ask how the Axiom of Choice fares. Choice -- that for any collection of nonempty sets, a set exists containing exactly one member of each set in the collection -- has always had a somewhat chequered history. Russell thought it was not self-evident, and anyway was well aware of the dangers of purported self-evidence. The Tarski-Banach paradox is derivable in ZF with Choice -- ZFC (pp. 175, 176; see also p. 164, fn. 38). As was shown by Specker, in NF the Axiom is refutable, i.e., the negation of the axiom is true. Yet Morris argues in detail (pp. 172-183) that if anything, this is to the credit of NF. 'Cantorian Sets' are those that have the same cardinality as the set of their singleton subsets (one expects this for standard sets). But NF features non-Cantorian sets as well as Cantorian sets. In the context of NF, standard mathematics is derivable, yet it remains so even if the sets dealt with are restricted to the Cantorian variety; indeed the Axiom of Choice can be supposed true under that assumption. However if we drop that assumption, we are free to investigate the properties of non-Cantorian sets, including those of the big sets.

As quoted by Morris, Quine writes in his Set Theory and Its Logic:

So what we have is just another case, and a beauty, of unconventional behaviour on the part of non-Cantorian classes . . . Classical results can still be got in NF by inserting, where needed, a premiss that a class concerned is Cantorian. One could look upon NF as merely more general, in this respect, than set theories where everything is Cantorian. (p. 179)

3. This follows on the heels of a careful appraisal of Boolos' argument in his well-known 'The Iterative Conception of Set'. Boolos takes the essence of set to be given by the Iterative Conception. He defends it as beginning with individuals, then forming sets of individuals, then sets of those, and so on, with the crucial difference from Russell being that the procedure is cumulative; all objects so specified are still of the same 'type'. Boolos defends it largely by adverting to our ability, at each stage, to 'collect together' the items, into a new object, the set of such items. Perhaps the crux of Morris' finding against this view is here:

set theory sounds like a theory of collections of very ordinary physical objects: Here are some things, and we collect them together. This sounds fine when we think about, say, rocks or paper clips . . . [b]ut would hardly make sense of abstract collections of numbers . . . Here are some numbers. Now we bind them up into a whole. This is only a metaphor. (pp. 159-60)

And down the page: 'How would our collecting together an infinite number of objects be made sense of according to our ability to bind objects together?'.

Boolos realises that his collecting-together procedure will not yield the axioms one needs for mathematics. Indeed not even the axioms of replacement and extensionality can be justified by his main thought behind the iterative conception (nor from an explicit formalisation of iterative conception called 'stage theory', pp. 154-6). For Morris, this failure means that 'we are left adding axioms in a somewhat ad hoc way so as to restore the power that was lost in restricting the conception of set [to the iterative conception]' (p. 164). Yet the iterative conception does issue in the Axiom of Regularity (of Foundation), when it was not assumed by the purported founder Zermelo of the iterative conception, in the system Z (pp. 164-5). Zermelo assumed it only as an hypothesis where he couldn't derive a result without it, for it isn't evident that there are no sets such that x ∈ y and y ∈ x (for example, it is thinkable that the cardinality of all cardinals, or the universal set, are sets x such that x ∈ x). Whereas the iterative conception rules out not only NF but any non-well-founded set theory such as Aczel's. Morris writes, 'the view that ZF somehow gives us the only viable account of sethood relies more on prejudice than on fact' (p. 185).

4. To reiterate, Morris concludes not with the falsity of any set theory in particular, but with the wise counsel of allowing for a diversity of set theories (there are to be sure difficulties with NF; pp. 183-5). Different set theories are different explications of the initially imprecise notion of set, each with its strengths and weaknesses, certainly none with a unique claim on intuition. The most natural conception -- one governed by the thought they are extensions of concepts -- is contradictory. (And Morris points out that there are a multitude of interesting connections among these theories; pp. 185-94). There is no 'extramathematical metaphysical conception to which [a theory] must be fitted' (p. 188). The modern notion of set is inevitably artificial. Until Cantor came along one would have had only foggiest intuitions of infinite sets -- 'What would have been Leibniz's view of the continuum problem? Discuss' -- and what we now tend to call our 'intuitions' are far from being unschooled (pp. 143, 175, 178-9, 188). Quine learned and applied this attitude of pragmatism from the beginning. Though Morris does not make the point, the later Quine would take this attitude towards science more broadly, suggesting explications or reformist explications -- not 'conceptual analyses' -- of such notions as belief, empirical content, and ontology generally. Indeed all objects, said the later Quine, are in the end theoretical.

It is worth noting, in passing, how alien this estimate of set theory is from contemporary metaphysics, with its emphasis on 'grounding' and 'fundamentality'. Such questions perhaps are arguably clear if one's attitude towards philosophical questions is one of conceptual analysis, or analysis of the things themselves, where one purports to refer to a thing and query its nature; but not according to Quine's naturalistic attitude, which sets almost the entire store on empirical science as revealing the world insofar as it can be revealed. Quine's attitude as Morris characterises it (p. 133) is exploratory and comparative. According to it, even such well-established maxims as the premium put on ontological thrift, or the primacy of first-order logic, are potentially retractable. This attitude suggests that what grounds what, or whether an axiom or entity is more fundamental than another, doesn't make clear sense. It is a matter of what theory one is assuming.

I have not done justice to the subtlety and detail of Morris' overall argument; but for that one does have recourse to the book itself.


I owe thanks to Peter Hylton, Andrew Lugg, and Adam Rieger.