Quine's Naturalism: Language, Theory, and the Knowing Subject

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Paul A. Gregory, Quine's Naturalism: Language, Theory, and the Knowing Subject, Continuum, 2008, 147pp., $143.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826490995.

Reviewed by John P. Burgess, Princeton University


In this era when results of empirical scientific research are being appealed to all across philosophy, when we even find moral philosophers invoking the results of brain scans, many profess to practice "naturalized epistemology," or to be "epistemological naturalists." Such phrases derive from the title of a well-known essay by Quine,[1] but Paul Gregory's thesis in the work under review is that there is less connection than is usually assumed between Quine's variety of naturalized epistemology and what is today taken, by opponents and proponents alike, to constitute epistemological naturalism. To put it bluntly, as Gregory does in the opening sentence of his introduction, Quine "has not been well understood."

If there is less connection between the Quinean and other epistemological naturalisms than there has often been taken to be, on Gregory's account there is also much more connection between Quine's position on epistemology and his positions on other contentious issues, beginning with his notorious rejection of the analytic/synthetic distinction. The "tightly woven nature" of Quine's philosophy, which "hinders the unraveling of his views," is indeed cited as the foremost reason why Quine's naturalism has not been well understood.

A second reason cited is Quine's pithy or breezy style. Gregory suggests that what he calls Quine's "penchant for elegant prose" leads him to offer arguments and explanations too terse to be easily followed. By contrast, no one is likely to complain of excessive terseness in the work under review, where a style antithetical to Quine's is deliberately adopted. Everything is spelled out, and more than once at that; nothing is left to be worked out by the reader; and there are frequent pauses: pauses to review what has come before, pauses to preview what is still to come, and just occasionally pauses to digress a bit into side issues.

While explicitly a defense of Quine against criticisms by epistemological traditionalists, skeptical or foundationalist, Gregory's work is implicitly a criticism also of philosophers who have taken themselves to be adopting a generally Quinean orientation while avoiding what they have taken to be the most dated aspects of Quine's approach, such as his addiction to stimulus-response analyses. Such philosophers tend to think of themselves as agreeing with Quine that traditional epistemology should be abandoned in favor of scientific psychology, while disagreeing with Quine by thinking of psychology as "cognitive science" rather than "behavioral science." But one cannot, according to Gregory, detach one aspect of Quine from another in this way.

As I myself share the outlook of the philosophers thus implicitly criticized, I should say at the outset that I think Gregory is generally quite convincing on matters of Quine exegesis. His work, together with a rereading of Quine's essay in the light thereof, has convinced me that I am less of a Quinean than I thought -- though it has not persuaded me that I ought to become more of a Quinean than I am.

After a preview of these matters in his first, introductory chapter, Gregory turns to an analysis of Quine's essay, which he finds to be triply misleading, owing to its emphasizing some aspects of Quine's view at the expense of others, presupposing without comment many contentious Quinean doctrines, and omitting arguments. The appearance created is that Quine moves immediately from the failure of one particular (and by hindsight not especially plausible) foundationalist project (Carnap's in his Aufbau) to the conclusion that we might as well just settle for empirical psychology in place of philosophical epistemology. Such an appearance is, of course, the appearance of a non sequitur.

Such a move as Quine appears to make invites an objection in the form of a dilemma. Either Quine expects psychology to justify or validate science, in which case his procedure is viciously circular, since psychology stands as much in need of justification or validation as any other science, and more so than some. Or else Quine is abandoning any normative role for epistemology in favor of a purely descriptive account of scientific theory-construction and theory-choice (or perhaps, a purely descriptive methodology, which merely tells us what norms prevail in the scientific community without pretending to be in a position to offer any justification or any critique of such norms, as purely descriptive grammar merely tells us what norms prevail in a linguistic community). In which case he is abandoning epistemology, even if he retains the word "epistemology," transferring it to some other subject. And Gregory concedes that there is a good deal of textual support for the "replacement interpretation," according to which Quine is doing just what the second horn of the dilemma describes.

Gregory, however, in the end rejects the replacement interpretation. He reads Quine as an empiricist writing for fellow empiricists and taking for granted the empiricist answer to the normative question of how theories are evaluated -- that they are to be judged by their predictive success -- while calling for a study by psychology of how the theories that are to be thus evaluated come to be created. The "calls for psychology" -- and according to Gregory they are really calls for a whole list of disciplines: psychology proper, neurology, linguistics, genetics, and history -- are calls for a psychological account of the context of discovery, not the context of justification.

Quine does, according to Gregory, have a distinctive take, not on whether predictive success is the criterion by which theories are to be evaluated, but rather on what constitutes predictive success. For the predictive success of a theory is the correctness of the observation sentences it implies,[2] and Quine has a distinctive, behavioristic view of what an "observation sentence" is. Quine avoids involvement in traditional disputes among empiricists over whether "observation sentences" are to be thought of as formulated in a language of sense-data or in a language of everyday objects by taking an "observation sentence" to be simply any sentence that any two members of the speech community, given similar sensory stimulation, will either both assent to or both dissent from.

Gregory then devotes two chapters to the first horn of the dilemma mentioned above, the circularity objection. He develops at a leisurely pace an explanation of why Quine "placidly accepts" that his procedure is "globally circular," an explanation according to which such global circularity is inevitable given the rejection of the analytic/synthetic distinction.

In brief, the argument is that without an analytic/synthetic distinction, to speak a language is already to adopt a substantive theory, and hence there is no alternative to "beginning in the middle of things" or "rebuilding our ship on the open sea." (Note in particular, as Gregory does, that under Quine's definition of "observation sentence," speakers of the same language necessarily agree about such sentences.) If there is no analytic/synthetic distinction, then "one cannot engage in meaningful conversation while remaining theoretically uncommitted."

The assumption on which the circularity objection is based, that circularity is, like infinite regress, avoidable and objectionable -- an assumption which Gregory calls that of "linear propositional support" -- thus becomes untenable once the analytic/synthetic distinction has been rejected. Quine's rejection of that distinction is inseparable from a change in conception of what can be considered a cogent epistemological question or issue, a move to a conception on which the issue of circularity is not cogent.

Of course, if Quine's critics who charge that his rejection of the analytic/synthetic distinction is based on old-fashioned behavioristic assumptions are right, and if Gregory is right that Quine's defense against the circularity objection is based on his rejection of the analytic/synthetic distinction, then Quine's defense against the circularity objection is based on a kind of assumption on which few scientifically-oriented philosophers today, when scientific psychology has long since moved past the old stimulus-response approach, would wish to base anything of importance.

In his last two chapters Gregory addresses the "normativity" and "change of subject" objections, which are really two aspects of a single objection, the second horn of the dilemma mentioned earlier. From what has been said so far the reader can probably guess what line Gregory will take towards the claim that Quine's so-called epistemology is not normative (as anything properly called "epistemology" must be). On Gregory's interpretation, Quine is, in fact, fully committed to the norm of predictive success, of correctness of observation-sentence implications.

Moreover, given the one categorical imperative to seek predictively successful theories, many hypothetical imperatives will follow. Scientific investigation of scientific reasoning should provide guidance as to which means are most likely to help achieve predictive success, and so provide guidance as to scientific theorizing, once predictive success has been accepted as the end of scientific theorizing. In this sense, naturalized epistemology as Quine conceives it can be fully normative. It can distinguish rational from irrational, though it will be instrumental rationality that is in question. (Hence it is no surprise that Quine was associated with CSICOP.)

But what of skeptical objections to the effect that all the observational predictions of a theory may be correct, and yet the theory not true? Here again Gregory finds Quine's complacency in the face of a philosophical worry tied to his distinctive views about meaning. On the old empiricist theory of meaning, two sentences that imply the same empirical predications have the same meaning, so that there can be no question of one being true and the other false. Quine rejects the old empiricist theory of meaning on the grounds that it is really only whole theories, not individual sentences, that have observational implications. But if that is his only grounds of objection, and he agrees with the old empiricists otherwise, then he will in fact hold that two theories that imply the same empirical predications have the same meaning, so that there can be no question of one being true and the other false. And this is, minus some subtleties, essentially Gregory's account of why Quine is unimpressed by skeptical doubts.

Here again Gregory draws our attention to the unity of Quine's thought. But at the same time we cannot help but notice, though it is not Gregory's aim to emphasize it, the datedness of some of Quine's key assumptions. The whole tendency of Gregory's approach is to make Quine's philosophy in one way more impressive, on account of the tightness of the interconnections between doctrines in different areas (the areas of philosophy of language and epistemology, in particular), and the thoroughness with which such connections have been thought through. But at the same time this interpretation tends to make Quine's philosophy in another way less attractive, on account of the dogmas of old-fashioned empiricism (and its psychological wing, behaviorism) on which so much else is made to depend.

But the aim of a primarily historical work is not to make the figure from the history of philosophy whose views are discussed look more or less attractive. It is to show the historical figure as he or she really was. In this I believe Gregory, with his firm command of a wide range of Quinean texts, and his close attention to implicit connections, has succeeded remarkably well.

[1] "Epistemology Naturalized," in W. V. O. Quine, Ontological Relativity and Other Essays, Columbia University Press, 1969, pp. 69-90.

[2] Gregory does not much discuss Quine's views on logical implication, which is less a matter of holding some sentences to be logically true than a matter of holding some inferences from sentence to sentence to be logically valid. One suspects that in the end the willingness to make such inferences must be, for Quine, merely a firmly-established behavioral disposition. Indeed, Quine nearly says as much himself at the close of "Truth by Convention" (in O. H. Lee, ed., Philosophical Essays for Alfred North Whitehead, 1936, Longmans, pp. 90-124).