Race, Empire, and the Idea of Human Development

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Thomas McCarthy, Race, Empire, and the Idea of Human Development, Cambridge University Press, 2009, 254pp., $28.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521740432.

Reviewed by Tommy Lott, San José State University


Although philosophy of history no longer exists as an area of study within the discipline, important questions inherited from Enlightenment thought regarding historical development have not gone away. Indeed, the whole point of McCarthy's account is that, even with all of its problems, the idea of development is inescapable. Worse still, variations of it have, in many unspoken ways, underwritten modern global white supremacy. For this reason, he believes it is an idea that is dangerous and necessary. Squarely facing this dilemma, he insists that there is no alternative to the ongoing deconstruction and reconstruction of the idea of development to accord with demands of global justice.

The text is divided into two parts, each of which is devoted to rethinking Western conceptions of development that are interlinked historically with racism and imperialism. McCarthy notes that important aspects of the contemporary discourse on globalism require an analysis of their manifestations after the displacement of biological notions of race and the disappearance of colonies. Recasting Kant's moral theory in terms of Jurgen Habermas' "discourse ethics," he proposes to replace Kant's categorical imperative with "the discourse-ethical principle of equal participation by those affected in establishing the normative structures that govern their life together." (14) Although his analysis unearths damned-if-you-do, damned-if-you-don't dilemmas regarding development, McCarthy insists upon retaining the moral thrust of Kant's cosmopolitanism in favor of proposals that emphasize economic change at the expense of this. Although my assessment of the main features of McCarthy's account is generally favorable, as a major shortcoming I cite the inconsistency of his dismissal of alternatives to development entirely for pragmatic reasons. Some environmental concerns he seems to wave off suggest that, for pragmatic reasons, the idea of development can be drawn into question as well.

In the opening chapter McCarthy criticizes dominant perspectives for pretending to be universal. Along with Marxism, some of the exclusionary views he cites include critical race, postcolonial, and ideal justice theories. By combining an interdisciplinary understanding of global policies with insights he derives from Kant's account of universal history, he questions whether these positions are empirically well-informed or well-grounded morally. His analysis aims to overcome these limitations with a more interdisciplinary Kantian orientation that better accommodates the contingent nature of development.

McCarthy appropriates what he takes to be salient features of Kant's philosophy of history -- a view he examines critically in Chapters 2 and 5. His discussion is lucid and succinct, drawing together several key components of Kant's treatment of race and development as "impure ethics." He points out that, although Kant's Groundwork was a "pure" rational part of his moral philosophy, his Metaphysics of Morals has a chapter on duties to members of racial subgroups that figures into his natural-historical account of racial hierarchy. He also notes that Kant's natural history relies on a notion of providence that adds a teleological dimension to his racial classifications. He nicely spells out Kant's idea that development has to be understood in terms of an ultimate end of nature. Although Kant understood this ultimate end to be the full development of the natural human capacities, it was grounded on theology, such that his "Kingdom of God on earth" will display a moral unity. Importantly, Kant believed this outcome would not be due to any conscious intentions of historical actors for, unlike Adam Smith and Karl Marx who also incorporated versions of this view of historical progress into their doctrine, Kant held that behind the senseless course of human events there is a divine purpose.

McCarthy is attracted to the "impure" empirical part of Kant's ethics. He maintains that a key component of development is a Western-style legal system. When this is established, the cultural progress of underdeveloped societies will ultimately lead to a cosmopolitan federation of nation-states. It should be noted that, in this regard, Kant's vision of the moral outcome of development seems to eschew cultural pluralism. Following Kant, McCarthy advances a notion of development that requires the propagation of this aspect of Western culture on the ground that it is necessary for the realization of a global moral community as the final end.

For a variety of reasons McCarthy also takes issue with certain aspects of Kant's account. The most obvious problem is the tension between Kant's moral view and his view of development. How can he justify the human sacrifice exacted by historical progress to arrive at the kingdom of ends? How is his view of non-whites as biologically inferior consistent with his view of cosmopolitan society? Why prefer his monocultural account of cultural progress to a multicultural universalist account? McCarthy situates Kant's philosophy of history within a genealogy of historical works that attempt to account for the sociocultural development of humans as a whole. By focusing on the recent discourse on globalization, he aims to make clear "the cost and benefits of 'progress'" (133). This bit of consequentialism is not completely at odds with his Kantian orientation, for he seems to be primarily concerned with moral trade-offs. Rather than reject outright influential grand metanarratives of Hegel and Marx, or what he takes to be macrohistorical alterations of these by Weber and Habermas, he prefers to view criticisms of their weaknesses as suggesting instead the need for "chastened and decentered" proposals for change. (133) Kant's emphasis on morality is especially relevant given that so often social change for underdeveloped nations occurs under the auspice of postcolonial economic domination, with innumerable social ills accompanying the imposition of capitalism and modernity on traditional cultures.

Even though McCarthy acknowledges a role for metahistorical grand narratives, he objects to Hegel's metaphysical perspective and Marx's economic determinism. He prefers Kant's commitment to a morally obligatory pursuit of justice and his promotion of a "universal-historical" view that provides hope. Although systems theory and functional adaptation views held by thinkers such as Talcott Parsons and Niklas Luhmann cannot be ignored, McCarthy believes that they cannot account for the sociocultural aspects of development that render judgments regarding "progress" inherently ambivalent.

With the sociocultural impact of development in mind, McCarthy turns to Habermas's writings to account for what he calls the "costs and benefits" of social change and, hence, to make clear how better to manage the ambivalence engendered by modernization. The lesson he derives is that democracy is required "to develop effective normative structures -- moral, legal, political" that promote global justice. The aim of these normative structures is to include the voice of victims of modernization as participants in the decision-making and to entitle them to make informed choices about polices that risk having a negative impact.

Some of McCarthy's remarks regarding this proposal suggest that democracy has to exist at the level of nation states as well as internationally. This aspect of his proposal needs to be made clearer. To be sure, neither he nor Kant meant to suggest that a world federation governed by cosmopolitan law will be realized any time soon -- if ever. The intermediate step they settle for is a voluntary league of nations with a progressive agenda for ongoing social change. There is a major difficulty facing the proposed democratic inclusion. As he later acknowledges, the reality of global decision-making and policy-setting processes are often dispersed and multileveled in a manner that tends toward decentralization. He opposes this by pointing out that, even without a global government or world state, human rights and justice require global governance to remain global.

In Chapter 3, McCarthy examines the use of Darwin, generally, to provide a scientific justification of white supremacy and, particularly, to indicate the moral ground for US expansionist policy from the end of Reconstruction to World War I. The genealogy of race and racism he traces in the American context before World War I is meant to be an important example of global white supremacy. Instead, it narrows his discussion by leaning heavily on a white-black paradigm of racial domination, momentarily putting aside the more complex racial hierarchy informing Kant's cosmopolitanism. He astutely deconstructs a once prominent view of blacks in the South as an inferior, "pre-modern" people to show how the biological grounding of racism gave way to a sociological view of urbanized African Americans as dysfunctional due to the lingering cultural effects of slavery. This shift to cultural racism has resulted in the prevalence of post-biological conceptions of racial difference. Institutional racism, based on economic disparity, is now perpetuated through the harmful effects of stereotypes and stigmatization. McCarthy's point is that, whether cultural racism takes the form of blaming the victim or blaming the racist, it renders biological difference unnecessary. Another equally important implication of the shift to cultural racism he identifies is that, rather than a natural and permanent inferiority, deficiencies due to racial difference are in principle improvable, and assimilation is possible.

McCarthy's explanation of how the Social Darwinists used biology to rationalize political domination is superb. Blumenbach's techniques of cranial measurement, used earlier to establish racial differences, gave way by the end of the nineteenth century to Darwin's theory of evolution applied to social groups. Natural selection, interpreted by Spencer as "survival of the fittest", provided a scientific conception of the social progress of non-White groups, as well as a standard for comparing their lack of progress. It also provided a justification for the belief in the "manifest destiny" of the white race to dominate the world. To the extent that non-White races are incapable of governing themselves, there is a "white man's burden", an obligation to intervene on their behalf.

An important feature of Kant's cosmopolitanism, lightly treated by McCarthy, is the hierarchical nature of his racial classification. McCarthy embraces too quickly scientific findings that reiterate a highly contested three-race theory based on correlations of genetic differences with the historical races, i.e., classifications based on stereotypes of physique. He rightly takes the significance of such correlations to be diminished by the fact that genetic differences are greater within each racial category than between them. While some scientists take this to imply that there are no significant differences between races, McCarthy is a bit unsure about scientific findings regarding racial differences with regard to IQ measurements and the effectiveness of certain medicines. But if genes are scattered across racially diverse populations, shouldn't the scientific findings regarding IQ and medicine likewise be scattered? Although there are plenty of reasons to be wary of such correlations, McCarthy does not consider the extent to which many outside of science do not believe that black, white, and yellow people have pretty much the same genes. The tension between the scientific citations he uncritically juxtaposes is left unresolved.

Questions regarding global justice can be either forward- or backward-looking. The history of European imperial domination requires a consideration of backward-looking questions regarding reparations for slavery and colonialism. In Chapter 4, McCarthy takes up the question of reparations for slavery in America as a form of "transitional justice" involving public memory and collective identity. He maintains that a failure to deal with the past will inhibit any attempt to remedy the lingering effects of slavery and segregation. His strategy is to appropriate some of Habermas' reflections on the obligation of present generations to come to terms with the legacies of their national misdeeds. When applying Habermas' teachings regarding recent debates in Germany about the place of the Jewish Holocaust in public memory to the reparations debate in America, McCarthy takes a strong position against recent immigrants not bearing any responsibility. He insists upon including "the political community as a whole," regardless of ancestry, based strictly on a principle of inherited benefits and liabilities. (115) Following Habermas, he also takes a strong position against leaving a painful past unacknowledged. He maintains that, without a public acknowledgment of past racial injustice, we face a danger, similar to the German experience, that challenges to the idea of racial inferiority will lack a motivational force, allowing racism to persist.

Part II begins with Chapter 5, in which McCarthy reconsiders Kant's philosophy of history, but only as a lead-in to a discussion of Mill's liberal imperialism in Chapter 6, followed by a sketch of his own view in Chapter 7.

As criticism, McCarthy's gloss of John Stuart Mill's rationale for a colonial policy of benevolent despots has several shortcomings. Mill's thinking was that democracy requires a prior stage of tutelage before a transition to self-government can succeed. This policy accords with a version of Kant's cosmopolitanism that would morally permit colonial intervention insofar as it benefits the development of non-European societies. Moreover, on pragmatic grounds to be determined by using McCarthy's cost/benefit criteria, it is very likely that, in many societies that are suffering under rampant corruption, benevolent authoritarian rule as a transition stage will rank higher than alternatives.

The criticism of Mill's benevolent despot that McCarthy wants to advance seems to apply equally to his own view of relations between industrialized Western nations and non-Western poorer nations. His analysis begins with a Kantian question, "Isn't the idea of constructing a universal history of the entire species unavoidable?" (131) While acknowledging the "costs" of Western modernization, he concludes that non-Western societies have "no choice but to modernize to survive in terms largely set by the demands of capitalist accumulation." (149) This conclusion rests on the assumption that there is no empirically possible alternative to Western economic hegemony.

Kant's cosmopolitanism, like other global systems accounts, can justify intervention by industrialized nations on behalf of poorer nations. Hence, the imposition of Western modernization globally is the source of McCarthy's worry about too great a cost -- where this is primarily a concern with certain sociocultural consequences for non-Western societies. If the aim of development, however, is to reduce poverty, this is primarily economic -- although, as social phenomena, there can be overlapping cultural factors as well. When the costs are primarily economic, however, Kant goes by the wayside and empirical questions regarding utility are warranted. In using the term "costs," McCarthy (and Habermas) seem to have in mind something like trade-offs between immorality, or injustice, and utility, where these trade-offs are understood to entail overlapping moral and economic issues. Slavery and colonialism are modes of economic exploitation, as well as immoral practices. Likewise, reparations as a form of "restorative justice" are equally an economic remedy for economic harm.

For McCarthy, the aim of backward-looking justice is to rectify past economic harms, while forward-looking justice aims to avert future sociocultural harms that are due to modernization. In various places he remarks on the costs of modernization, but leaves unclear whether he takes the aim of development to be primarily economic or sociocultural. His commitment to a Kantian emphasis on morality is partly a response to policies that attempt to divorce cultural from economic concerns. For this reason, perhaps, he never considers the question of whether there can be industrialization without Westernization. This oversight may stem from his Kantian standpoint, which renders it difficult to fathom non-Western alternatives to development. On strictly moral grounds, however, to speak, as he does so often, of de-colonized nations as having "no choice" is a mistake. They clearly have a right of self-determination that includes a right not to industrialize, as well as, pace Marx, a right to return to their traditional culture. This moral right can be distinguished from pragmatic concerns having primarily to do with whether, from an economic standpoint, it is a wise choice not to industrialize.

When speaking of the "costs" of modernization McCarthy wants policies that balance economic advancement of poorer nations with global justice -- past and future. In keeping with his belief that we have no alternative but to rethink the idea of development, in Chapter 7 he proposes seven rules that serve as guidelines. His first five rules reveal an abiding commitment to a Eurocentric model of development as the universal model. In the first he advocates the inclusion of a postcolonial critique of globalization discourse regarding modernization, but, in the second, he wants to constrain radically different modernities to fit the Western model, only allowing variations necessary to accommodate local circumstances. His third and forth rules champion Kant's Eurocentric view of the past and future, leading him to speak of European history having "marked out the one true path of modernization." (223) His fifth rule outright condemns, as "practically objectionable … some postdevelopment thinking of difference," but there is no discussion of this line of thought. (224) Rule six addresses the problem of nations having been permanently disabled due to their underdevelopment by colonial powers with a call for reparations to deal with the continuing harm. His final rule seven acknowledges, again with little discussion, the limits of growth as a serious environmental concern.

I have already commented on McCarthy's views summarized in rules one through four, and six. In what follows, I will briefly discuss rules five and seven. With regard to rule seven, the absence of a discussion of environmental concerns as a crucial factor in how we rethink development diminishes the moral thrust of McCarthy's analysis. Although he cites "limits to development" as a problem, he does not spell out the implications of this for underdeveloped nations. He appears not to take seriously the very real possibility of humans overdeveloping the planet or the present trend of global capitalism to foster the idea of endless growth through multinational commoditization of human needs to perpetuate pointless consumption. He refers in a note to the growing clout of China, India and Brazil as members of the World Trade Organization, but he does not consider the implications for the environment of their emergence in the global economy. If their too-rapid industrialization is not sustainable for environmental reasons, this suggests that the globally harmful consequences (costs) of their growth raise important environmental concerns that cannot be omitted from a discourse on globalization.

With regard to rule five, McCarthy needlessly closes off discussion of the question of whether modernization involving industrialization without Westernization is possible. His cursory rejection of post-development thought, even that which is consistent with his Critical Theory perspective, is puzzling. His "practicality" objection to de-linkage theory, for instance, seems misplaced in cases like Eritrea. For many struggling non-Western nations, perhaps selectively de-linking from a global system that creates more dependence and increases poverty, advisedly, should be part of a strategy to deal with long-term harm brought on by structural adjustments that have been externally imposed as a condition for aid from Western nations.

Perhaps McCarthy is right to maintain that in most cases exercising the option to de-link from the West may be impractical. However, his rule of thought regarding development that supposes no choice but to industrialize is not warranted. His rules of thought are not very good summaries and tend to overstate his more nuanced discussion of these issues in earlier chapters. Although he commits to the idea of a Western-style legal system to provide international normative structures to realize Kant's metahistorical vision of a future global justice, there is no discussion or even suggestion of how this might come about. His insistence upon the inclusion of non-Western voices at the decision-making level is a way to foster pluralistic values and to prevent Western domination in sociocultural matters pertaining to development. However, this only seems to amount to a reiteration of a desire for global justice and does not tell us how it may ever be achieved.