Race, Rights, and Justice

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J. Angelo Corlett, Race, Rights, and Justice, Springer, 2009, 228pp., $139.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781402096518.

Reviewed by Roderick M. Stewart, Austin College



This collection of essays is intended to be a companion to Corlett’s previous books in the philosophy of law: Responsibility and Punishment (Springer, 2006) and Race, Racism & Reparations (Cornell, 2003). Again, readers will find here the forceful voice of an analytical philosopher in the Feinbergian tradition taking on hotly contested issues often associated only with the work of recent post-modern and critical race theorists. Corlett divides the essays into three parts: two chapters on the interpretation of constitutional law by judges; two on international law and calls for global justice; finally, three chapters on individual vs. collective rights (especially for indigenous peoples) and humanitarian intervention. In every chapter, Corlett goes to great lengths to live up to Blanshard’s recommendation that even if in the end an author is not right, he put all his cards on the table, debated his opponents fairly, and especially always wrote clearly enough to be found out (p. 19). Let us consider these chapters in turn.

Chapter 1 is Corlett’s propaedeutic to his own theory of constitutional interpretation in Chapter 2. Here he lays out and criticizes the most well-known account of original intent, by Robert Bork. On Bork’s view, the judge’s role is to figure out the principles of a given constitutional or statutory text as it was generally understood at enactment. Corlett calls Bork’s appeal to textual principles a “moderate originalism” in that it does not make the naïve assumption that a text at enactment spoke inerrantly and completely. For Bork, if it is unclear how to apply such a document to a particular situation, then the judge must still seek only those principles governing the text that are faithful to the intent of the original framers and ratifiers (as might be evidenced by other extra-constitutional documents and letters by those framers and ratifiers). Here (moderate) “originalism” is joined with the distinct thesis of (moderate) “intentionalism”. If such “original” evidence for meaning and intent at enactment is not available in any trustworthy form, then for Bork this is where the law and judge must stop and remain silent or risk legislating subjectively from the bench.

Corlett notes that while such a legal hermeneutics of original framers’ and ratifiers’ intent is theoretically consistent, it still presupposes practically that they as a group were in fact largely unified in their opinions and broad constitutional “intentionality” when in fact they were not. Corlett also argues that even if there were a set of largely unified supporting documents, then the “originalists” like Bork would seemingly have to defend the likely racist, sexist and imperialist assumptions of those texts, many of which were later gradually overturned and some of which still need addressing (see Corlett’s earlier work on reparations to African-Americans and Native Americans). Here perhaps Corlett could have been a bit more careful not to blur the line between legitimate de-mythologizing of founding fathers and at places leaving the impression that all their ideas were the mere products of blind racist ideology (pp. 26-27). The historical reality of colonial North America, like any other period historians try to understand, is likely a complex one, especially when trying to assess the effect of ideology on intentions, attitudes and eventually degrees of moral agency. Ideology like agency comes in many degrees and forms.1 Here we may keep in mind Frederick Douglass’ own changing views about the complex relations between various U.S. founding documents once he broke from the Garrisonians and their total indictment of the Constitution and its 3/5’s Compromise clause. Later Douglass re-emphasized to his audiences that the Declaration of Independence was a more foundational document that could be used to reconstruct the offending clauses of the original Constitution. Indeed, it is precisely this “older” Ur-document and its reference to a natural right to overthrow tyrants that Corlett uses to challenge another well-known Bork position on limiting the right of protected free speech to include prohibitions against advocating abolition of the U.S. government or disobeying some of its laws.2 Finally, third, Corlett notes that if originalists take seriously their claim that judges only heed the intentions of the framers at enactment, then little seems to be left of the idea of independent judicial review by later judges in dialogue with the framer-ratifiers. Bork, then, is asking for too much silence from judges and excessive deference to the framers. For Corlett, then, a reasonable legal hermeneutic must view any founders as just as fallible as later judges.

Chapter 2 builds on the previous critique of originalism with a defense of Ronald Dworkin’s “integrity” or coherence theory of legal interpretation. Corlett first makes a plausible case that Justice Benjamin Cardozo’s writings are an important predecessor to Dworkin’s views.3 Corlett then ably defends Dworkin’s theory against J. L. Mackie’s legal positivist stance and Andrew Altman’s critical legal perspectives. At issue here is whether and how judges are justified in deciding whether new cases “fit” with “settled” precedents, implied principles and background theories of political morality. Corlett sees his task as filling out what is still missing in Dworkin’s coherentist account, namely, determining when we are justified in counting something as already settled. Without such an account, Dworkin could easily be read as some sort of foundationalist and intuitionist about settled precedents. Such a view would then routinely privilege older precedents over newer ones. Corlett’s friendly amendment for dealing with hard cases is first to make no law, new or old, beyond revision when measuring coherence. Second, if an older and a more recent law conflict on a hard case, “recently established laws take precedence … because a community is more directly bound to the rules which it itself adopts freely than those which it inherits from a previous generation.”4 By “adopting freely” Corlett also means adopting that law which, relative to its competitors, has greater, weightier reasons and “fit” given a larger political morality and its account of rights (a view he elsewhere calls a form of ethical realism).5

In Part II (Chapters 3 and 4), Corlett shifts his topic to the question of international law and justice. Chapter 3 provides helpful background, first, with a review of Kant’s argument for cosmopolitan justice and H. L. A. Hart’s skeptical arguments against such an idea. Second, Corlett builds on the classic work of Lon Fuller and proposes twelve requirements for a viable system of international law, with a particular eye to conflicts between an international tribunal and a nation-state. Chapter 4 then proceeds to recent discussions of global justice found in Rawls’ The Law of Peoples (and its emphasis on sovereign peoples and states) and cosmopolitan liberalism (with its emphasis on sovereign individuals). While Corlett supports Rawls’ theoretical inclusion of sovereign peoples in an otherwise liberal framework,6 Corlett still faults both Rawls and cosmopolitan theorists for inadequate attention to issues of compensatory justice (especially reparations for Native Americans and African Americans).7 Corlett’s remedy is to provide the Rawlsian framework with a missing Principle of International Compensatory Justice. Whether or not one could counter successfully that Rawls’ original first principle of justice already contains such compensatory considerations implicitly, Corlett’s point is well taken against the almost exclusive concern today with distributive justice as a fair solution to problems like global poverty. Given the historical connections between much contemporary poverty and the racist, sexist and imperialist policies of many developed countries, re-distributive measures alone are insufficient. Corlett rightly asks the reader to consider addressing the victims of Nazi genocide with only a program to establish their post-war equality of opportunity in Europe with no talk of reparations (p. 113). Finally, Corlett concludes this chapter with a defense of Rawls’ notion of “decent” but non-liberal peoples. According to Corlett arguments by some cosmopolitan liberals that such an idea is too tolerant of extreme inequalities in traditional societies have an undischarged burden of proof to provide, and not just assume, a nuanced theory of when traditional practices do and do not constrain citizens’ choices to embrace those very practices. Corlett notes (following Feinberg) that embracing a practice is consistent with knowingly not exercising a right to exit that practice.

Part III focuses on the concept of rights as the bedrock of any theory of justice. Chapter 5 takes Allen Buchanan to task for arguing that the distinction between liberal and Marxist political theory is taking rights seriously.8 On Buchanan’s analysis, Marx thought that the “rights of Man” are only needed if there are classes whose interests clash; thus, a classless society would have no need for rights. Corlett, however, argues that Marx’s silence about rights under communism does not entail that they were not necessary at all. In fact, Corlett argues that Marx could well be interpreted as advocating rights against capitalist exploitation and alienation and for meeting basic human needs in an egalitarian manner. Finally, Corlett cites an 1842 text where Marx clearly argues (before Mill) for freedom of expression and speech (p. 149). While Corlett’s point against Buchanan is well taken, it should not be overstated. A third interpretive hypothesis is equally plausible: namely, that Marx’s texts were silent and spotty about rights under communism because he never got around to thematizing them in a complete way. We should not, then, overstate Marx’s own views either negatively or positively. Whether Marxism as a broad approach in political morality requires the concept of rights is a different point.

In Chapter 6 the reader gets to see the heart of Corlett’s concerns, the issue of whether collectives of a decision-making type (e.g., CAIN, the Congress of American Indian Nations) may be said to have some collective rights. These rights would include the collective right to claim reparations and of secession from other individuals or collectives (e.g., the U.S. government). Corlett seeks to defend his view against both eliminativist and reductionist versions of moral rights individualism. On the latter views, the history of the Doctrine of Discovery and Manifest Destiny in the New World either just is, or reduces without remainder to, clashes between individuals who happen to be members or agents of groups. Crucial to Corlett’s analysis (and rejection of such individualism) is his distinction between a mere “aggregate” of randomly assembled individuals and a “conglomerate”. The latter is a group or collection whose members are bound together normatively by common concerns such that harm to one member of the group constitutes harm to each and every member of the group.9 While someone might make a case that a single individual could “secede” from some collective (at the limit), that certainly is not the usual sense of the term. A right to secession, then, presupposes the idea of a collective right (even if that right is exercised by a subset or representative of the collective). Corlett then develops this idea by recognizing that his theory of collective rights will be plausible only if it is justified by some larger (non-utilitarian) political morality that can account for various things: conflicting rights claims, the legitimate place of individual rights, which collectives possess which rights and why, and the correlation between such rights and duties.

Chapter 7 returns to the problem of international justice and takes up the issue of justifying one country intervening in the affairs of another. Corlett’s case study is the current U.S. involvement in Colombia’s ongoing civil war and problem with drug cartels. Drawing on the work of Walzer and Rawls,10 Corlett argues that (violent or non-violent) humanitarian aid and intervention are morally permissible only if, first, those intervening states are legitimate themselves (they have “clean hands”) and, second, all the people who have an urgent need for help have voluntarily agreed to such help (as an exercise of their sovereignty). For Corlett, the U.S. has problems passing the first legitimacy condition because it has yet to atone for its treatment of African Americans and Native Americans (Corlett’s Reparations Argument), and thus its motives will always be suspect. Whether in Colombia or against Nazi Germany, at best the U.S. now or then might be said to have a moral privilege to aid.

In the case of Colombia, it is further complicated by the fact that the U.S. has not done enough to shut down its own demand for cocaine products. The second condition is also problematic because it is unclear whether the Colombian government is representative of its citizenry given the deep civil strife. Yet, even if it were evident that most Colombian citizens support the fight against the Marxist guerrillas and drug cartels, there is still the problem of remediating the unjust treatment of the indigenous U’wa people by the Colombian government in its dealings with Occidental Petroleum over use of U’wa tribal lands. Thus, until the U.S. has compensated for its own record of injustices, its moral claim to be permitted to help is weaker than is usually admitted.

For Corlett, justice in this case will require at the very least that the U’wa people be allowed to secede from Colombia and that some other third party with cleaner hands and more credible motives be invited to intervene (e.g., the United Nations). To his credit, Corlett does consider the objection that his analysis rules out too quickly any aid given by a Bad Samaritan when purely Good Samaritans may not be realistically available.11 Yet, while Corlett’s demythologizing argument here is an important one and often overlooked, more will likely need to be said on this real-world issue. Moral agents, whether individual or collective, have complex narratives and often find themselves called upon to “multi-task” in different temporal dimensions. One such phenomenon is bringing virtues to bear on a new urgency while all along trying to make up for a longstanding vice. Think of the alcoholic parent with a yet to be discharged and shameful past, but who still tries to get his kids to school on time, care for aging parents, or help a neighbor fix a flat tire. In the end, political morality, too, must be more in the direction of sinners than saints.

In sum, without a doubt Corlett has lived up to Blanshard’s recommendation that even if we philosophers are not always right in what we say, we do put all our cards on the table, debate our opponents fairly, and always write clearly enough to be found out. Corlett’s book has all these intellectual virtues and more. It is to be particularly commended for its steadfast emphasis on overlooked issues of compensatory justice and marginalized peoples.

1 Corlett in fact speaks more carefully in Chapter 2 (p. 61) when he says “we must accept whatever truths of the Constitution are able to survive the process of demythologization, opening it and ourselves to the future of mutable constitutional content for the sake of eliminating injustice.”

2 See Corlett, p. 23. Bork’s classic statement of this position is his 1971 Indiana Law Journal article, “Neutral Principles and Some First Amendment Problems”. Bork defends his “theoretical” exercise in his book, The Tempting of America: The Political Seduction of the Law (Macmillan/Free Press, 1990), pp. 333-336. However, see also the negative review of this book by Douglas Laycock in Ethics, Vol. 101, No. 3 (April 1991), pp. 661-663.

3 Here his point is similar to Richard Posner’s criticism of Dworkin in his Cardozo: A Study in Reputation (University of Chicago Press, 1993), p. 29.

4 Pp. 58-59. Corlett qualifies this point in case the present day community has also freely adopted the older law. Corlett’s emphasis on the autonomy of “We the People” now is a form of liberalism that contrasts with communitarian appeals to communities over time and their traditions. In this sense, Bork’s originalism may be labeled a form of communitarianism. Corlett’s liberalism, however, should also be seen as compatible with group or collective rights, as he makes clear in Chapter 6.

5 See his reply to critics of his 2003 book, “Race, Racism, and Reparations”, Journal of Social Philosophy, Vo. 36, No. 4 (Winter 2005), p. 573. Corlett’s implicit epistemological model here would seem to derive from Keith Lehrer’s form of ecumenical coherentism, given the references on p. 51 (note 84) and p. 53 (note 91).

6 Here Corlett follows Bernard Boxill’s defense of Rawls against Beitz by emphasizing the importance of the diversity of cultural goods that shape individuals’ conceptions of their good. See Bernard Boxill, “Global Equality of Opportunity and National Integrity”, Social Philosophy and Policy 5 (1987), pp. 143-168.

7 Corlett and Boxill’s argument is interestingly similar to Nozick’s famous rejection of time-slice principles and use of historically sensitive ones. The crucial difference, though, is that Corlett’s liberalism allows for group rights to compensation and not just for an individual’s right.

8 Allen Buchanan, Marx and Justice (Totowa, N.J.: Rowman & Littlefield, 1982).

9 Here Corlett could well help himself to Charles Mills’ concept of “constructionist realism”. While races, ethnicities and peoples are not biological natural kinds, once they are “constructed” or brought into being in classification schemes they may be said to have certain causal powers (a standard candidate for what is real). See Mills’ discussion of Corlett’s 2003 book, “Reconceptualizing Race and Racism? A Critique of J. Angelo Corlett”, Journal of Social Philosophy Vol. 36, No. 4 (Winter 2005), pp. 546-558.

10 Michael Walzer, Just and Unjust Wars (New York: Basic Books, 2000); John Rawls, The Law of Peoples (Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 1999).

11 Corlett acknowledges Richard Miller’s article, “Respectable Oppressors, Hypocritical Liberators: Morality, Intervention, and Reality”, in Deen Chatterlee and Don Scheid, eds., Ethics and Foreign Intervention (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2003), pp. 215-250.