Radical Cartesianism: The French Reception of Descartes

Placeholder book cover

Schmaltz, Tad M., Radical Cartesianism: The French Reception of Descartes, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 302pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521811341

Reviewed by Peter Anstey, University of Sydney


Most historians of early modern philosophy are familiar with the writings of Malebranche, La Forge, Cordemoy and of course Arnauld, but there is another seam in late seventeenth-century Cartesianism which to date has received very little attention, at least among Anglophone scholars. It is this more radical branch of Cartesianism, the Cartesianism of Robert Desgabets (1610-78) and Pierre-Sylvain Regis (1632-1707) that Tad Schmaltz has expounded for us in his splendid new book Radical Cartesianism.

The book is largely one of exposition, containing extensive treatments of the radical Cartesians’ contributions to the eucharistic debates from the 1660s, the Cartesian way of ideas, the nature of mind and its relation to body and the doctrine of eternal truths. Yet there is an additional agenda in so far as the book is an apologia not simply for the intrinsic value of radical Cartesianism, but also for its significance in late seventeenth-century French philosophy.

So what was radical about these little-known Cartesians and what were their central doctrines? By positioning Desgabets and Regis in relation to Spinoza and Malebranche, Schmaltz argues that there is a niche that these two philosophers filled in the theologico-philosophical debates from the 1670s until the end of the century. Unlike Spinoza, who after all was never truly championed in France during this period, Desgabets and Regis saw themselves as disciples of Descartes; they saw themselves as “moderns” perfecting the system of philosophy first propounded by their master. And unlike Malebranche, who developed the latent Platonic elements in Descartes’ philosophy, they developed the master’s philosophy of mind and ideas in a direction more compatible with the Aristotelianism of the schools. It is interesting to speculate, though this is beyond Schmaltz’s agenda, as to why the more Platonic development of Descartes eventually triumphed and why this more “Aristotelian” Cartesianism was almost totally eclipsed. But regardless of what the historiographers might have to say on this issue, it is indicative of the maturation of recent Cartesian scholarship that this lost seam in Cartesianism is now being brought to light.

The central doctrines of Desgabets and Regis (eliding subtle but important differences between them) are as follows. First, they transformed the basic metaphysical categories of Descartes’ ontology by positing that extended objects consist of an atemporal essence with temporal modal determinations. It is the atemporality of extended substance that enabled them to argue for the indefectibility of matter and, in Desgabets’ case, for a somewhat radical account of transubstantiation. Desgabets claimed that the real presence of Christ is to be explained by Christ’s soul being united to the Host. Second, this modified Cartesian ontology enabled them to argue that our clear and distinct ideas of external substances actually correspond to mind-independent objects. Third, the notion of atemporal essences plays a role in their elaboration of Descartes’ doctrine of eternal truths. Eternal truths are those truths about the atemporal substances that God has created with complete indifference, substances that were unknown to God before he created them. Fourth, Desgabets and Regis argued that human thought requires an embodied soul. This is not just a denial that there are purely intellectual thoughts because all thought derives from the senses; it also involves the positive thesis that thought involves duration and is necessarily linked to motion. This is clearly the most Aristotelian of their distinctive doctrines.

Schmaltz expounds the development and deployment of these doctrines in a way that is closely argued, like a tightly-knitted garment with well-integrated references to debates within the secondary literature and unobtrusive quotes and references to primary sources. A real strength of the volume is that it is not weighed down by superfluous references and the trappings of scholarship, but rather follows the contours of philosophical arguments and develops the often sophisticated positions of Desgabets and Regis and their contemporaries. It must be said however, that this style forces the reader to work hard and there are sections where I had to “come up for air” every few pages for fear of losing the thread of the argument. This is due as much to the philosophical methodology of the radical Cartesians as to Schmaltz’s style, for Desgabets and Regis dealt with such issues as the doctrine of transubstantiation in a manner similar to the late scholastics, with a complex set of ontological distinctions and self-conscious polemical posturing.

My only caveat on the general design of the book is that it fails to give the reader a sense of the broader sweep of the radical Cartesians’ commitment to a Cartesian natural philosophy. Yet this surely must have informed and even motivated their rigorous application of Cartesian principles to such problems as the Eucharist, perception and the nature of mind. We know that Desgabets was intimately involved in the first French blood-transfusion experiments, that Regis was strongly influenced by the Cartesian experimentalist Rohault, that Locke’s discussions with Regis included natural philosophy, that Pierre Coste (translator of Locke’s Essay) regarded Regis as one of the leading contributors to Cartesian physics through his Système and that he was eventually admitted to the Académie des sciences in 1699. Moreover, contemporaneous with defenses of Cartesianism on the doctrine of transubstantiation there was a plethora of defenses of Cartesian cosmogony. From Amerpoel’s Cartesius Mosaizans (1669) and Cordemoy’s Copie d’une lettre écrite à sçavant Religieux (1669) to Barin’s Le Monde Naissant ou La Creation du Monde (1686) we find defenses and elaborations of Cartesian cosmogony which parallel the eucharistic controversies in so far as they attempt to show that Cartesianism is consistent with Scripture, even if it was on the Eucharist that the condemnations of Cartesianism were most explicit.

Yet Schmaltz seems very much to take as his starting point the traditional construal of Descartes’ philosophy and that nest of philosophical issues that surrounds it (the cogito, dualism, the nature of ideas, etc.) rather than to start from a broader conception of Descartes’ project and that of his followers. Thus, apart from a brief treatment of Desgabets’ rejection of Cordemoy’s atomist interpretation of Cartesianism, there is almost no mention of natural philosophy in the book. Nor is there any discussion of the radical Cartesians’ moral or political philosophy. There is however, a brief treatment late in the book of the relation between faith and reason as the issue arose in the exchange between Pierre-Daniel Huet and Regis. Interestingly, this debate seems to be a kind of Jansenist analogue of the debates over the roles of faith and reason in the Socinian controversies across the Channel in the writings of Locke, Stillingfleet and others.

Of course one cannot do everything in a monograph of this size and Schmaltz has furnished us with a thorough, even meticulous, and admirably clear exposition of the quite fascinating and distinctive doctrines of the radical Cartesians. However, this reader at least would have liked the focus of the book to be more clearly set within the full compass of late seventeenth century Cartesianism. Nevertheless, Tad Schmaltz has performed a real service to Anglophone philosophers and intellectual historians by filling in an important gap in the broad spectrum of Cartesianisms in the late-seventeenth century. While preparing this review I realized that my own university library lacks any editions of the works of Desgabets and Regis. It is testimony to the persuasiveness of Schmaltz’s exposition of their views that these works are now on order.