Radical Interpretation in Religion

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Frankenberry, Nancy K. (ed.), Radical Interpretation in Religion, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 248pp, $24.50, ISBN 052101705X

Reviewed by Charles Taliaferro , St. Olaf College


Nancy Frankenberry has assembled ten original essays which will be of special interest to those committed to a naturalistic and generally pragmatist critique of religion. The word “radical” in the title of this collection seems a little puzzling. The essays are said to be “radical” in the sense that they question the “root assumptions in the study of religion” (p. xiii). The essays “move away from older models of representation and symbolic expression to holistic ways of thinking about the interrelations of language, meaning, beliefs, desires, and action” (p. xiv). The essays are introduced by Frankenberry as built on the assumption that religions should be explained “in entirely naturalist terms, rather than in supernatural or faith-based premises” (p. xiv). This may be “radical,” though it is certainly not new or at odds with “root assumptions” of religious studies today. The naturalistic dismissal of the truth of religious convictions may or may not be legitimate, but it is hard to see it as fresh, bold, and out of step with the contemporary intellectual climate. The current state of play in the philosophical study of religion typically entertains both naturalistic and non-naturalistic points of view. In fact, a failure to take the naturalist critique of religion seriously today would rightly be considered “radical” because it questions the very “root assumptions in the study of religion” as it is firmly established in most university and college institutions. Undertaking inquiry into religion in a “holist” way is also not novel. Aquinas could be described as promoting “holistic ways of thinking about the interrelationships of language, meaning, beliefs, desires and action.” I suggest that the contributors to this collection are not radical “outsiders” challenging an entrenched regime where an abundance of “fideisms and passing gurus have flourished” (p. xvi). Be that as it may, these essays do address philosophically important issues concerning the interpretation and justification of religious beliefs and practices.

In the opening essay, Terry Godlove Jr. defends the important role of belief in religion and the study of religion. “While students of religion need not believe in God, we do need to believe in belief “ (p. 24). I suggest that Godlove’s essay (Chapter One) should be read in relation to Catherine Bell’s contribution (Chapter Five), where she struggles with the difficulty of giving neither too much nor too little role to beliefs in her study of Chinese religion. I find Godlove’s case for the indispensability of belief in religion thoroughly convincing.

Jeffery Stout articulates the methodology of Robert Brandon’s normative pragmatism, locating Brandon’s contribution in relation to Davidson’s and Rorty’s work. This is a fine essay on contemporary pragmatism.

Rorty’s essay considers the cultural and political conditions for arguments about God’s existence. Rorty holds that

Debate over … concrete political questions is more useful for human happiness than debate of the existence of God. They are the questions which remain once we realize that appeals to religious experience are of no use for settling what traditions should be maintained and which replaced, and after we have come to think natural theology pointless. (p. 76)

Maybe so, but Rorty’s bifurcation between political philosophy and natural theology is open to question. One can find religious experience and natural theology to be philosophically viable as well as privilege “concrete political questions.” In fact, there have historically been many occasions where philosophical debate over God’s existence has been profoundly intertwined with debate over human happiness. I believe this to be true for the classic sources (Augustine, Anselm, Aquinas), but if you want a “modern” example á la utilitarianism, consider William Paley and his fellow theological utilitarians. Their arguments against the slave trade and economic inequality fit easily beside their theistic arguments.

One of Rorty’s reasons for dismissing religious experience as irrelevant philosophically seems odd, namely that reports of religious experience need to be assessed in light of a comprehensive philosophy, framework or world-view.

In short, God-reports have to live up to previous expectations, just as do reports of physical objects. They cannot, all by themselves, be used to repudiate those expectations. They are useful for this purpose only when they form part of a full-fledged, concerted, cultural-political initiative. This is what happens when a new religion or church replaces an old one. It was not the disciples’ reports of an empty tomb, all by themselves, that made Europe believe that God was incarnate in Christ. But, in the context of St. Paul’s overall public relations strategy, those reports had their effect. Analogously, it was not Galileo’s report of spots moving across the face of the planet Jupiter, possibly caused by the transits of moons, that overthrew the authority of the Aristotelian-Ptolemaic cosmology. But, in the context of the initiative being mounted by his fellow Copernican cultural politicians, that report had considerable importance. (pp. 60-61)

Few defenders of the evidential value of religious experience would disagree. Typically, the appeal to the evidential, justificatory role of religious experiences takes place in the context of a comprehensive, cumulative case for a religious world view. The only point where defenders of religious experience might diverge from Rorty concerns how far he goes in dismissing “experience” as any sort of independent check on one’s philosophy.

I can sum up what I have been saying about appeals to experience as follows: experience gives us no way to drive a wedge between the cultural-political question of what we should talk about and the question of what really exists. For what counts as an accurate report of experience is a matter of what a community will let you get away with. Empiricism’s appeal to experience is as inefficacious as appeals to the Word of God unless backed up with a predisposition on the part of a community to take such appeals seriously. So, experience cannot, by itself, adjudicate disputes between warring cultural politicians. (p. 61)

But imagine you live in a political culture run by old-fashioned behaviorists who deny that feeling pain is anything more than actual and dispositional behavior. I do not see why the appeal to subjective states cannot be evidence against eliminative behaviorism, even if the majority dismisses such a philosophical objection. Analogously, I suggest that the appeal to the apparent experiential awareness of the divine can be evidence in support of a religious world-view eve if the majority fails to recognize this.

Rorty may have anticipated this objection from analogy because he illustrates his view on the philosophical irrelevance or marginal importance of experience in reference to current debate on consciousness.

I can make my point about the irrelevance of religious experience to God’s existence a bit more vivid by comparing the God of orthodox Western monotheism with consciousness as it is understood by Cartesian dualists. In the unphilosophical sense of the term “conscious,” the existence of consciousness is indisputable. People in a coma lack consciousness. People are conscious as long as they are walking and talking. But there is a special philosophical sense of the term “consciousness” in which the very existence of consciousness is in dispute. (p 64)

If you are sympathetic with Daniel Dennett, early Stephen Stich, Quine, Paul and Patricia Churchland, Rorty’s earlier work, you may agree. But, you will disagree if you think their philosophy of consciousness has left something vital unexplained (namely consciousness), as has been proposed by Galen Strawson, Ned Block, Thomas Nagel, David Chalmers, and Colin McGinn. Incidentally, I believe Rorty may be seeking some rhetorical support for his rejection of the appeal to experience here by suggesting that only “Cartesian dualists” object to Dennett et al. because they deny the indisputable existence of consciousness (in the ordinary and “philosophical sense” of the term). None of those just cited who appeal to the apparent evident reality of experience are Cartesian dualists.

Wayne Proudfoot offers an interesting, naturalistic understanding of William James—challenging Rorty’s version of James. James’s conception of the cosmos in terms of a moral order is commended by Proudfoot as a worthy, secular ideal.

We can recognize with James that imaginative ideals embodied in religious belief and experience provide leverage that can free us from some of the desires and demands that press in on us. But the unseen order that provides that leverage need not be, and is not, something “not ourselves.” The moral order consists of what men and women have put there, of Geist, and the proper way to study it is through the humanities and social sciences, especially history. (p. 92)

Notably absent from the list of disciplines is theology.

The remaining essays highlight different resources for philosophy of religion. E. Thomas Lawson takes stock of cognitive science. Hans Penner addresses the question of how we should read myths. Frankenberry draws on Davidson to challenge what she calls “the Theology of Symbolic Forms.” Jonathan Smith uses the Hebrew Bible’s narrative of manna to test Durkheim and other sociologists of religion. Maurice Bloch takes up the extent to which religious beliefs are counter-intuitive. He writes: “The Counter-Intuitive is Everywhere” (p. 144).

Although the word “radical” is used in several settings in the book, there is nowhere the radical suggestion that some non-naturalist, religious view of the cosmos might be true.