Radical Platonism in Byzantium: Illumination and Utopia in Gemistos Plethon

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Niketas Siniossoglou, Radical Platonism in Byzantium: Illumination and Utopia in Gemistos Plethon, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 470pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107013032.

Reviewed by John Sellars, Birkbeck College, University of London


This book about the Byzantine-Renaissance philosopher George Gemistos Plethon (1355-1452) is historical and contextual in approach, rather than philosophical. It is as much (if not more) concerned with the history of theology as it is with the history of philosophy. Historians of philosophy looking for an account of Plethon's philosophy may find themselves slightly disappointed but they will nevertheless learn a lot about Byzantine intellectual history in this erudite monograph.

The book is divided into four parts, preceded by a lengthy introduction. The introduction sets out a range of aims and objectives along with a series of methodological reflections about the nature of intellectual history. One of Siniossoglou's central claims is that Platonism and Christianity are ultimately incompatible and conflicting "modes of thinking and perceiving one's place and role in this world" (19) and as such can never be adequately brought together into some form of Christian Platonism. This "irreducible philosophical difference" (19) is the central preoccupation of the book and it also lays the foundation for one of the central theses of the book: what Peter Gay called Enlightenment 'modern paganism' was pre-empted by Byzantine Platonists such as Plethon (38).[1] Although Plethon the Platonist is often assumed to have an intellectual kinship with someone like Marsilio Ficino, Siniossoglou argues that this cannot be right given Ficino's syncretism. Instead "from a philosophical viewpoint Plethon anticipates Spinoza rather than the Christian Platonism of Ficino" and he "anticipates the early modern reception of ancient philosophy that was effectively a reaction to Renaissance Platonism" (45).

Part I of the book is concerned with the history of Byzantine Platonism before Plethon. Its central thesis is that rather than coming out of the blue, Plethon's radically pagan Platonism had a number of predecessors and ought to be seen as the culmination of a continuing tradition of genuine paganism stretching back to the late ancient Neoplatonists. In short the claim is that Christianity did not triumph in the sixth century after all and a genuine pagan tradition persisted in the Byzantine world. The central figure here is Michael Psellos (71 ff.). One of the ways in which Psellos rescued pagan Platonism as a viable philosophical position was by disentangling it from the occultist and theurgic aspects of late Neoplatonism (78).

Much of the discussion in the first three chapters that make up Part I focuses on the history of theological disputes, with much space (in chapter 2) devoted to Hesychast mysticism and a range of other non-philosophical positions. This makes for interesting intellectual history but it is hard to see just how much it contributes to a better understanding of Plethon's philosophy. A discussion of polemics against Plethon by George of Trebizond and George Scholarios Gennadios (in chapter 3) brings us into closer contact with Plethon though again theological disputes remain centre stage.

Part II promises to explore the central themes of Plethon's philosophy of pagan Platonism, with chapters on epistemology (chapter 4), ontology (chapter 5), and theology (chapter 6). Siniossoglou argues that the central feature of Plethon's epistemology is "epistemic optimism" (163): genuine knowledge is possible and that knowledge in turn makes happiness possible. It is through reasoning that we secure knowledge, not inspiration or revelation. This view is "rooted in the belief that the human intellect is ultimately divine" (163) in the Platonic sense of the word. According to Siniossoglou this epistemological claim involves a series of ontological claims as well, most notably that "god is not beyond Being, but is Being" (165). This involves a break with traditional Neoplatonism and Siniossoglou suggests that it aligns Plethon with Pico della Mirandola's position in the Oratio de Hominis Dignitate.

This brings us to chapter 6, which explicitly addresses ontology. Central to Siniossoglou's account of Plethon's ontology is the claim that Being is the supreme genus, with no Neoplatonic One or Christian God beyond or above Being. As in the previous chapters this is discussed via an account of the intellectual context of Plethon's work, in this case the fourteenth century Hesychast controversy (225). While this historical contextualization is of interest, I would have liked to have seen more in the way of conceptual or textual analysis at this point, to help get clear the precise details of Plethon's philosophical position. Comparisons and contrasts with Proclus and Aquinas are made very swiftly (e.g., 229) and it would have been nice to have seen the various positions laid out more slowly and in more detail. Happily the central thesis is admirably clear: Plethon's ontology rejects the Neoplatonic tradition originating with Plotinus of placing the One above Being and goes back to a Parmenidean tradition exemplified by Middle Platonists such as Numenius (244-245).

Siniossoglou goes on to suggest that Pico's De ente et uno is a Neoplatonic response to Plethon, re-asserting the priority of the One over Being (249). However Pico seems concerned in that work (see chapter 5) to refute the arguments of those Platonists (especially the Proclean-inspired Neoplatonism of Ficino) who assert that the One is superior to Being. If Pico were re-asserting the Neoplatonic position in De ente then it would also put him at odds with his position in his Oratio, already alluded to by Siniossoglou.

It is when tackling these ontological questions that the book's methodological approach begins to show signs of weakness. Siniossoglou writes that "from the viewpoint of intellectual history Plethon's philosophy is no abstract trans-historical or ahistorical exercise. It is a reply to contemporary philosophical and theological issues" (263). This is true enough but in order to grasp fully those philosophical issues we first need to get clear about the various positions within the historical debate. In this case we need a precise philosophical account laying out the respective positions of Plotinus, Proclus, Aquinas, and Pico (at the very least), if we are to situate and appreciate Plethon's own response to the issue. Intellectual history on its own is not quite enough here.

The next chapter, on theology, continues the same approach which, happily, works better in this case. Siniossoglou explicates Plethon's theological views within the context of competing theological positions. Plethon in his Nomoi is neither monotheistic nor polytheistic but rather henotheistic (278). Siniossoglou offers a detailed account of the complex hierarchy of gods in Plethon's Platonism, before going on to discuss his doctrine of fate, which may have been influenced by the Stoics (316). Siniossoglou suggests an account of fate drawing on both Stoic and Middle Platonic material (i.e., Ps.-Plutarch, De fato), but it would have been nice to have heard more about the way this worked, given that authors such as Calcidius (in Tim. 143-144) explicitly contrasted the two positions.

In Part III Siniossoglou considers Plethon's political philosophy. Plethon follows Plato, especially the utopianism of the Republic. Indeed he goes so far as to propose a division of an ideal society into three distinct classes (331), which, Siniossoglou notes, also mirrors a basic tripartite structure in Plethon's theology (333). Much of the discussion is taken up with practical proposals, such as reform of the Byzantine taxation system (e.g., 339). One striking feature that Siniossoglou draws attention to is the implicit acceptance of political violence in order to reform society into a better state (344). As another commentator put it, Plethon's political vision looks something like "an unpleasant mixture between a philosopher kingdom and a socialist military dictatorship" (Nicol, cited on 388)

Part IV offers a conclusion that picks up on the opening theme of an irreconcilable difference between Platonism and Christianity. Again Siniossoglou stresses that because of this difference Plethon's radically pagan Platonism ought not to be seen as a precursor of the Renaissance Platonism associated with Ficino. Siniossoglou suggests that it instead might be seen to anticipate Luther (403), although given what has already been said, it is difficult to see how far that claim could be pressed.

The book ends with a short epilogue that picks up the intriguing claim made at the beginning of the book that Plethon might be seen as some form of proto-Spinozist. This is part of a wider attempt to present Plethon as "significant because he announces hallmarks of modernity" (419). However the epilogue is far too brief to do justice to these claims. The suggestion that Spinoza offered a "new reception of ancient philosophy" and that his own philosophy was "paganising" both seem unconvincing (420), or at least require much more by way of justification. Indeed, one of the striking features of Spinoza's philosophy is his minimal explicit engagement with ancient philosophy. The principal feature of Plethon's "modernity" seems to be his rejection of Christianity in favour of a thorough-going Platonism.

Siniossoglou's aim is to present Plethon's Platonism as a radical alternative to attempts to synthesize Platonism with Christianity. He sees such attempts as intellectually flawed, so distinguishing Plethon from them is also meant to highlight Plethon's philosophical integrity. Siniossoglou explores these issues well, by situating Plethon's thought within the context of Byzantine intellectual history. For any reader who wants to learn more about the Byzantine intellectual (and especially theological) landscape this book has much to offer. However it doesn't have much philosophical discussion of Plethon's doctrines, and anyone looking for an analysis of his philosophy will have to look elsewhere.

[1] See Peter Gay, The Enlightenment: An Interpretation, The Rise of Modern Paganism (New York: W. W. Norton, [1966] 1977).