Radicalizing Enactivism: Basic Minds Without Content

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Daniel D. Hutto and Erik Myin, Radicalizing Enactivism: Basic Minds Without Content, MIT Press, 2012, 232pp., $30.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262018548.

Reviewed by Tom Roberts, University of Exeter


In this short but provocative book, the authors defend a radically enactivist philosophy of mind, upon which all but the most linguistically sophisticated cognitive and perceptual processes are free from representational content. The target of Hutto and Myin's critique is thus not only the standard opponent of the enactivist tradition -- namely, accounts of the mind that treat it in classical intentionalist or information-processing terms -- but also more moderate forms of enactivism itself, plus its close cousins the embodied, embedded, and extended theories of mind. Proponents of the latter views, although their themes and concerns are broadly consonant with radical enactivism in challenging neurocentricism and emphasising the active and world-engaging nature of cognition and perception, are deemed to remain in the grip of an unsustainable background commitment to representationalist thinking. A truly thoroughgoing anti-representationalism, the authors believe, is the logical outcome of the enactivist programme, and it is the role of the book to lay out the groundwork for such a project.

Much of the volume is devoted to delivering a sequence of arguments which aim to force the fan of content to retreat to an ever-narrower conception of when and where representational states are required, with a view to showing that only those creatures with substantial conceptual powers, scaffolded by public language, need be described in content-involving terms. The core proposal is the so-called Hard Problem of Content (chapter 4): the challenge of accommodating the essential features of intentional states -- their truth, reference, accuracy and logical properties -- in naturalistic terms. Reflective scrutiny reveals, the authors argue, that the notion of content as causally efficacious, and hence as serving to explain an individual's intelligent behaviour, is unfounded. Hutto and Myin examine familiar existing naturalistic theories of content, and find them unable to answer the Hard Problem. Models of content that appeal to patterns of reliable causal covariation holding between external states of affairs and components of internal processing systems (e.g., Dretske, 1981), and which rely upon a robust conception of information, are found to be unsuccessful in virtue of failing to explain the relevant truth-bearing properties. A relation of correspondence or indication, however reliable, explains nothing more than the conditions under which an internal state will be tokened; it reveals nothing about what the state "says" or "means".

Underpinning this criticism is the authors' scepticism about the explanatory usefulness of the traditional conception of informational content; naturally occurring meaning that can be transmitted and communicated, picked up and passed on, by biological organisms. The content enthusiast is, Hutto and Myin believe, forced into a dilemma here: either accept that information is nothing but causal covariance, in which case it is not a type of content proper; or hold that content is an irreducible, albeit natural, property of some physical systems (on the model of Chalmers' (2010) non-reductive analysis of qualia). A surprising omission from the chapter on naturalised theories of content is Fodor's (1987) asymmetric dependency thesis, which escapes the authors' critical attention. Perhaps they view it as susceptible to the objections that they take to face causal-covariation accounts, but more work would need to be done to demonstrate that Fodor's additional conditions -- which are after all in place in order to distance his position from simpler alternatives -- provide no way to respond to these challenges.

Teleosemantic theories of content do come under the spotlight, and are judged to fare equally poorly in meeting the demands of the Hard Problem (p71). Accounts of this sort (e.g., Dretske, 1995; Millikan, 1984, 1993) understand the content of an intentional state to be determined by two factors: firstly by the information transmitted by a signal that is received by a system, and with which the state in question covaries, and secondly by the consumers of the state, and their proper functions. States of a creature's visual system, for example, are said to represent features of the world in virtue of these states' consumers having the proper function of responding to signals that indicate those features. As Hutto and Myin point out, teleofunctional theories can accord varying weight to each of the two factors in giving an account of intentional content -- the relevant burden may be shouldered by covariance; by consumption; or by some combination of the two. If they are correct that mere covariation or indication cannot suffice for genuine content, they continue, then the prospects for a teleofunctionalism that relies heavily on the first factor are slim: there are no pre-existing natural meanings out in the world, ready to be consumed. On the other hand, a consumer-emphasising semantics struggles with the perennial problem of accounting for the intensional nature of contentful states: "biology lacks the resources for specifying under which guise such states might represent what they target" (p79).

In a more novel strategem, Hutto and Myin note that a pure consumer-semantic theory (what they call the Strengthened Millikan Maneuver (p75) upon which content is generated solely through the consumption of states, and does not pre-exist this consumption) is, in spirit if not in detail, closely akin to the core tenets of enactivism itself. Where the former speaks of content-creating systems within an organism, the latter talks of the organism's bringing forth meaning and value on the basis of its autonomy. On both programmes, the most basic forms of directedness are biological dealings, respondings, and strivings, all of which -- on Hutto and Myin's view -- can be understood as 'meaningful' for the organism without strict representationalist talk of reference, truth, or accuracy.

Hutto and Myin's anti-representationalist challenges aim to undermine not only these traditional neurocentric approaches to naturalising content, but also more recent embodied-embedded theories of cognition and perception whose explanatory resources include minimal, bodily or action-oriented representations. Sensorimotor theories of perception (e.g., Noë, 2004), upon which experience is said to be mediated by an implicit knowledge of the sensory consequences of skilful, exploratory movement, are said to over-intellectualise a creature's perceptual engagement with her environment by treating this implicit understanding as conceptual in nature. Radical enactivism, in contrast, considers perception to be non-predicative -- experiences do not attribute properties to objects -- and unmediated by stored representational content.

The negative, critical element of Hutto and Myin's discussion is largely compelling, and weighs against an unreflective acceptance of intentionalist thinking about the mind. Less satisfying, however, is the level of detail they offer concerning radical enactivism's alternative to representationalist explanations of mentality. One area where readers may reasonably expect a further degree of analysis is that of the structure of perceptual experience. The claim that perceptual states are non-predicative -- that they do not attribute properties such as shape, size, and colour to objects -- is counter-intuitive, and the authors offer little in the way of a replacement account of the phenomenology of how things do appear in experience. We are told that perceivers are "aspectual respondents" (p121): things can look or feel a certain way to an individual, without their representing anything as being thus and so. Radical enactivism treats experience as a direct engagement with the physical world; it aims to align itself with the sensorimotor approach whilst jettisoning its talk of implicit understanding or representational mediation. But this is to neglect the explanatory work that is performed by such knowledge on the sensorimotor model, namely in providing an understanding of the conscious subject's access to perceptual constancies: the ability to keep track, in perception, of the invariant features of objects in addition to their appearances (looks, feels, sounds). Sensorimotor theories show how aspectual respondents can come to perceive these unchanging properties amid the evolving patterns of motor-induced sensory stimulation. Without this representational component, it appears to be a consequence of radical enactivism that only linguistically expert agents are capable of seeing the observer-independent properties of objects (their shapes, spatial distribution, size, and so forth) at all, and this is a difficult bullet to bite.

From the non-predicative account of perception, with its rejection of associated correctness conditions, it follows that the distinction between veridical and illusory experience is hard for the radical enactivist to draw. Hutto and Myin believe that the standard intentionalist account of misperception as misrepresentation is unsuccessful because it depends upon ascribing to experience an unsustainable kind of content, a content that is both propositional and introspectively accessible, and is reliant upon high-level interpretative capacities being in play (pp124-5). Not only are creatures with basic minds, who are without fully-formed conceptual abilities, thus unable to undergo perceptual illusions, it is difficult to see how to resist this conclusion even for adult human perceivers once perception is understood to be content-free across the board.

A question arises, too, as to whether Hutto and Myin are entitled to help themselves to a content-rich analysis of high-level, linguistically-scaffolded minds and their capacities. Their anti-representationalism is not unrestricted, and their concession that adult human cognition involves content permits them to defend radical enactivism against some standard challenges, such as that intentional attributions appear to be required to explain rational, planned and deliberate behaviour. Yet we are told comparatively little about what it is for cognitive capacities to depend upon environmental scaffolding, and to require an inter-subjective space of shared language and artefact-use. In light of the high demands placed upon standard naturalistic theories of content by the Hard Problem throughout the volume, it is surprising that this account of content, and the critical role it is to play in the explanation of cognition and perception, is not addressed more fully in Hutto and Myin's exposition.

The radical implications of the book's central thesis are revealed in the authors' discussion of the extended mind hypothesis (chapter 7). They argue that proponents of extended cognition, who hold that items in the material environment can form a part of an agent's cognitive system when they satisfy a particular functional role, conceive of cognition in the wrong way: as something that begins within cranial boundaries and which can then extend out into the world when suitable representational opportunities, which offer parity with or augmentation of internal resources, arise. Radical enactivism rejects this picture, and Hutto and Myin suggest that what they see as a stalemate within current literature on extended cognition is a result of a pervasive commitment to a narrow, informational view of the mental. Once this is dismissed, they continue, the true extensive nature of the mind becomes clear: basic minds are not brain-bound; they are not defined by representational transactions; they are fully and constitutively world-involving.

Hutto and Myin present their work as an enactivist manifesto; an attempt to shake scientists and philosophers of mind out of intentionalist complacency, by offering an alternative that is not only possible but "a good bet". To an extent, their critical attack on traditional theories of content provides a justification for enactivist radicalism; but, in the absence of a more substantial explication of their position and its implications, it would be inadvisable to place too high a wager on its turning out to be the best way forward.


Chalmers, D. 2010. The Character of Consciousness. Oxford University Press.

Dretske, F. 1981. Knowledge and the Flow of Information. MIT Press.

Dretske, F. 1995. Naturalizing the Mind. MIT Press.

Millikan, R.G. 1984. Language, Thought, and Other Biological Categories. MIT Press.

Millikan, R.G. 1993. White Queen Psychology and Other Essays for Alice. MIT Press.

Noë, A. 2004. Action in Perception. MIT Press.


This work has been funded by the European Research Council under the European Community's Seventh Framework Programme (FP7/2007-2013), project title "Emoting the Embodied Mind (EMOTER)", ERC grant agreement 240891.