Ramsey's Legacy

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Hallvard Lillehammer and Hugh Mellor (eds.), Ramsey's Legacy, Oxford University Press, 2005, 196pp, $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199279551.

Reviewed by William Demopoulos, University of California/Irvine and University of Western Ontario


The ten papers collected in Ramsey’s Legacy originated as contributions to the Frank Ramsey Centenary Conference held in Newnham College, Cambridge, in the summer of 2003. The papers come very close to matching the scope of Ramsey’s contributions to philosophy and are a welcome addition to the record of Ramsey’s influence and achievement; they are:

“Ramsey’s Principle sustained,” by Jerome Dokic and Pascal Engel

“Success semantics,” by Simon Blackburn

“Ramsey’s legacies on conditionals and truth,” by Dorothy Edgington

“What is squiggle? Ramsey on Wittgenstein’s theory of judgement,” by Peter Sullivan

“Ramsey’s transcendental argument,” by Michael Potter

“Ramsey on universals,” by Fraser MacBride

“Empiricism and Ramsey’s account of theories,” by Pierre Cruse

“Ramsey sentences and avoiding the sui generis,” by Frank Jackson

“What does subjective decision theory tell us?,” by Hugh Mellor

“Three conceptions of intergenerational justice,” by Partha Dasgupta.

In this review, I will discuss only three of the papers. I do not make the usual disclaimer and plead limitations of space: my competence and interests extend only just so far. I will focus on the papers of MacBride, Potter, and Cruse. The thought that unites this selection is that each of these papers can be read as illuminating Ramsey’s role in the emerging preoccupation of twentieth-century analytic philosophy with the rational reconstruction of the language of science: MacBride focuses on the underlying logical framework; Potter deals with its extension to one capable of encompassing arithmetic and analysis; and Cruse’s paper discusses Ramsey’s view of theories in general. I conclude with a passing reference to Jackson’s paper, but this hardly counts as a discussion of it. For an informative overview of the volume the reader is referred to Hallvard Lillehammer’s useful editor’s introduction.

Ramsey on metaphysics: MacBride

In “Universals” Ramsey argued that the grammatical distinction between subject and predicate is not a guide to the “logical nature” of the constituents of the proposition a sentence expresses. Ramsey’s paper elicited many reactions. MacBride reviews two broad classes of response, which turn in different ways on the attribution to Ramsey of one or more of the following theses:

There is no subject-predicate distinction.

There is no particular-universal distinction.

There is no particular-universal distinction because there is no subject-predicate distinction (p. 85).

MacBride mounts a convincing case that none of these claims formed part of Ramsey’s analysis of the problem. After this incisive analysis and critical exposition of earlier discussions, MacBride argues that the significance of Ramsey’s paper should be read

against the backdrop of Russell’s evolving views on universals … . In the second edition of PM (1925), Russell characterized the particular-universal distinction in the following terms. After defining atomic propositions as propositions of the series of forms

(A) R1(x1), R2(x1, x2), R3(x1, x2, x3), …

Russell writes:

Here R1, R2, R3, … are each characteristic of the special forms in which they are found: that is to say Rn cannot occur in an atomic proposition Rm(x1, x2, …, xm) unless n = m, and then can occur as Rm occurs, not as x1, x2, …, xm occur. Terms which can occur in any form of atomic proposition are called “individuals” or “particulars,” terms which can occur as the Rs occur are called “universals” (PM, p. xix, see also p. xv, quoted by MacBride, p. 97).

As MacBride sees it, the difficulty raised by “Universals” is that

[n]othing has been done to rule out the epistemic possibility that the atomic propositions are composed entirely of two constituents,

(B) R1(x), R2(y), R3(z), …

or that they are composed entirely of three constituents,

© R1(x, y), R2(y, z), R3(z, u)…" (pp. 96—98).

Now if MacBride is right and this is Ramsey’s point, then Ramsey certainly appears to be conflating two different questions:

() Can we determine a priori whether the possible forms of elementary propositions are those of the (A)-series:

R1(x1), R2(x1, x2), R3(x1, x2, x3), …?

() Can we determine a priori which among the forms in the (A)-series are necessary for the representation of what we know?

Since our knowledge contains many a posteriori elements, the answer to () is clearly “No.” But it is less clear that the answer to () cannot be settled a priori, since it seeks only to accommodate the framework within which any component of our representation of the world is given.

That by “epistemic possibility” it is the a priority of our knowledge of elementary propositions that is at issue is supported by a comment of Ramsey’s cited by MacBride:

When I wrote [“Universals”] I was sure that it was impossible to discover atomic propositions by actual analysis. Of this I am now very doubtful, and I cannot be sure that they may not be discovered to be one of the forms expressed by R1(x1), R2(x1, x2), R3(x1, x2, x3), … . This I admit may be found to be the case, but no one can as yet be certain what atomic propositions there are; it cannot positively be asserted and there is no strong presupposition in its favor, for I think the argument of my article establishes that nothing of the sort can be known a priori (Ramsey 1926, p. 31, quoted by MacBride, p.102).

In addition to making clear that his concern was epistemological — is there an a priori justification for either the grammatical analysis into subject and predicate or for the distinction between universals and particulars? — the passage is interesting for revealing Ramsey’s continuing equivocation over whether it is () or () he is addressing. His remarks certainly allow for the interpretation that he would grant that () can be known a priori — in the sense that we might “discover atomic propositions by actual analysis” — and that () is necessarily a posteriori. On the assumption that PM formulates a universal language, which is the proper successor to Frege’s Begriffsschrift, a positive answer to () is not implausible, and the question at issue becomes one of articulating an appropriate framework within which any theory can be formulated, of finding the possible forms — in the manner envisaged by Russell — from which a theory’s propositions are to be constructed.

However, MacBride clarifies Ramsey’s argument and takes it a step further when he claims “that we cannot even rule out the epistemic possibility that the atomic propositions are composed [of forms like] f(f), a(a), f(a), …” (p. 98). Again, this can be correct only if by “rule out” one means “rule out a priori.” Otherwise it could be argued that the language of PM is adequate as it stands, so that the rejection of the first two elements of this series is justified on the ground that the reconstructive task PM seeks to address has no need of such forms. But I think that MacBride’s point is that such a response appeals to PM’s adequacy for the language of science and, as noted earlier, this is not what has traditionally passed for a purely a priori defense of assumptions like the completeness of the list of forms presented in (A). It also leaves open the possibility that there might be a plurality of adequate frameworks, and this raises the issue — still very much with us today — of how to adjudicate among them.

Ramsey on the foundations of mathematics: Potter

Potter’s paper deals with an unpublished argument of Ramsey’s for an axiom of infinity. Potter expounds the argument (which precedes “The foundations of mathematics”), dates when Ramsey discovered it and when he gave it up, offers a conjecture as to why Ramsey came to reject it, and places it in the context of Wittgenstein’s Tractatus and various of its doctrines regarding propositions and identity. Let me begin with Potter’s discussion of the Tractarian background.

Potter’s account emphasizes two key ideas that Ramsey learned from Wittgenstein: (i) A proposition is significant only insofar as it partitions the possible states of affairs into two classes. Potter calls this “Wittgenstein’s big idea.” It implies that tautologies cannot be regarded as significant propositions, and insofar as the propositions of logic are all tautologies, it implies that the propositions of logic are not significant propositions; in particular, they cannot be merely more general than the truths of zoology or any other special science (as Russell had claimed in the first edition of Introduction to Mathematical Philosophy). (ii) By (i), objects, which constitute the substance of the world, are constant across alternative possibilities; so also therefore is their number. It follows that there cannot be a significant proposition regarding the number of objects there are. At best language can show the cardinality of the world. Potter puts the point well when he says that “what changes in the transition between [possibilities] is how objects are combined with one another to form atomic facts; what the objects are does not change because they are the hinges about which the possibilities turn and hence are constant” (p. 72).

(There is another component of the Tractarian background that Potter discusses in his book (Potter 2000), but which forms no part of his discussion in this paper: It is a consequence of Wittgenstein’s views on identity, which Ramsey accepted, that (iii) mathematics cannot be based on Russell’s theory of classes because the notion of class that theory expounds — or, as Potter mysteriously says, “synthesizes” — is “… only the accidental notion of class” (Potter 2000, p. 213). On such a conception it can happen that there are no unit classes, since it allows for the possibility that every object might share all of its properties with at least one other object, and then there would be nothing to answer to the number 1. Thus even if an axiom of infinity could in some way be justified, a difficulty with PM‘s account of number would remain.)

To state Ramsey’s transcendental argument I need to mention Potter’s notational conventions. Let fx be any propositional function. Then Tx =Df fx ∨ ~fx holds whatever x may be. Thus, to “say” there are at least n things we write

pn =Df x1xnTx1Txn,

where, here and elsewhere, we assume “the Wittgenstein convention” that when a variable occurs within the scope of another variable, it is to be replaced by a different object. (Thus, for example, “”font-style: italic;">∃xy… " is read, "there is an object x and another object y … .") p0 is the infinite conjunction of the pn for all finite n and is Ramsey’s formulation of the axiom of infinity. Notice that p0 asserts — or appears to assert — the infinity of the number of objects of the type of individuals, and is to be contrasted with a claim about the number of things there are of some particular kind. Consider for example the series of propositions,

q1 =Df x(x is a hydrogen atom)

q2 =Df xy(x and y are hydrogen atoms)


where once again the Wittgenstein convention regarding variables is assumed. Each qn is an ordinary empirical proposition concerning not Tractarian objects but the number of things of a sort, and q0 — the conjunction of all the qn — says that there are infinitely many of them. The Tractatus imposes no prohibition against the significance of a proposition like qn since it is a genuine possibility that there are n hydrogen atoms, even if there are in fact m of them for m distinct from n. It is likewise a genuine possibility that there are infinitely many hydrogen atoms.

With these notational conventions in place, on Potter’s reconstruction (see p. 76) Ramsey’s argument becomes:

(1) If p0 is meaningful, it is true.

(2) If q0 is meaningful, p0 is meaningful.

(3) q0 is meaningful.

Hence, p0 is true.

Potter’s analysis of the argument, and his explanation for Ramsey’s later rejection of it, both focus on (1). I should note that Potter nowhere explains why the meaningfulness of q0 should imply that of p0. For example, it won’t do to argue that p0 is meaningful because p0 is implied by q0, at least not if its being meaningful coincides with its being a significant proposition. For then one would have to reject Wittgenstein’s conception of a logical proposition and treat tautologies on a par with propositions which effect a division among possible states of affairs. I would conjecture that Ramsey thought that the difficulty with the transcendental argument is its incompatibility with the first component of the Tractarian background, since it makes the mistake of treating the axiom of infinity as a significant proposition whose truth it purports to establish. I think it is fair to say that Potter’s analysis insufficiently emphasizes the extent to which the transcendental argument fails to respect Wittgenstein’s big idea, an idea Ramsey came to accept.

Potter’s thought is that Ramsey abandoned the transcendental argument as a result of his new conception of an extensional propositional function. In his essay, “The foundations of mathematics,” Ramsey rejected the notion of propositional function that we associate with Russell. Such functions are, in Ramsey’s phrase, “predicative” in the sense that the proposition fa which assigns f to a says the same thing of a as the proposition fb says of b. According to Ramsey’s new conception, a propositional function is an arbitrary mapping, in the present case from individuals to propositions, and fa and fb are merely the values of f for a and b as arguments. When this purely extensional notion of propositional function is adopted, the propositional function

T(x,y) =Df (f)(fx fy)

maps to a tautology when x = y and to a contradiction otherwise. (For, if we consider all such mappings f, there must be one among them that assigns x to the negation of whatever proposition it assigns y.)

Now suppose we leave the series of propositions q1 , q2 , … , qn , … as before, but define a new series of propositions

p1 , p2 ,… , pn , …

as follows:

p1 =Df xT(x,x)

p2 =Df xy ~T(x,y)

p3 =Df xyz ~T(x,y) ~T(x,z) ~T(y,z)


Then the axiom of infinity becomes the conjunction p0 of the pn for all such finite n. If there are only n Tractarian objects, pn +1 will be meaningful but contradictory and so, Potter argues, the first premise of Ramsey’s transcendental argument will fail. Thus on Potter’s analysis, Ramsey rejected the transcendental argument because its first premise is ruled out by his notion of an extensional propositional function: instead of the series p1, p2 , … , pn , … going from meaningful to meaningless, it goes from tautology to contradiction.

Admittedly the notion of an extensional propositional function is not a Tractarian idea. (The notion also exacts a high price, and as Potter notes (p. 80, and in greater detail in (Potter 2000, pp. 219 — 221)), Wittgenstein struggled to make precise his reasons for questioning its coherence.) But rather than being the source of Ramsey’s difficulties with the transcendental argument, extensional functions seem to have provided him with a bridge to a formulation of the axiom of infinity that is consistent with the Tractatus‘s conception of propositions in general, and of logical propositions and axioms of cardinality in particular. For suppose we revise the transcendental argument first by replacing “meaningful” with “consistent.” Then of revised premise (1) we can say that if it was ever plausible that if p0 is meaningful it is true, it can hardly be any less plausible that if p0 is consistent it is true. Next, replace “true” with “tautologous,” and observe that with the addition of this modification, the argument purports to show how the axiom of infinity is a tautology, if it is a tautology or a contradiction:

(1*) If p0 is consistent, it is tautologous.

(2*) If q0 is consistent, p0 is consistent.

(3*) q0 is consistent.

Hence, p0 is a tautology.

So revised, the argument does not commit the error of conflating a logical proposition with a significant one. The revised argument reduces the problem of showing that the axiom is a tautology to showing that it is consistent. It therefore appears to provide an account of the nature of the axiom’s status of the sort logicism requires. But this is only an appearance, since no particularly compelling reason in favor of the conclusion that the axiom is a tautology has been offered. Since the consistencies of q0 and p0 are equally problematic or unproblematic, the achievement of the argument consists almost wholly in its reformulation of the axiom of infinity. This would seem to offer a rather natural explanation of why Ramsey never advanced the argument in its revised form.

Ramsey on theories: Cruse

Cruse’s essay is an extended defense of the proposal that the “content” of a theory is expressed by its Ramsey sentence, which is what Cruse means by “Ramsey’s view of theories” and “Ramsey’s theory.” As Cruse himself is concerned to emphasize, what counts as a theory’s Ramsey sentence is relative to a specification of its vocabulary and the decision, relative to such a specification, concerning which terms to “ramsify” - which terms to replace with new variables of the appropriate logical category when existentially generalizing to “the” Ramsey sentence of the theory. On standard positivist and post-positivist reconstructions of the language of science, a theory’s primitive non-logical vocabulary is divided between its O(bservational) and T(heoretical)-terms, where the former refer to properties and relations that hold only of observable entities, and the T-terms refer to properties and relations that hold only of unobservable entities. A more fine-grained partition (and the partition Cruse favors) would distinguish between O-terms, T-terms, and terms which refer to properties and relations that hold of both observable and unobservable entities — the so-called “mixed” terms.

The “classical” use of Ramsey sentences proceeds by replacing all T-terms with new variables and then existentially closing the result. There is a well-known difficulty with this approach that has its origin in a criticism of Russell’s The Analysis of Matter, which was elegantly stated by M.H.A. Newman. Neither Russell’s book nor Newman’s discussion of it makes any mention of Ramsey’s view of theories, let alone Ramsey sentences. The Analysis of Matter appeared in 1927 and Newman published his paper in 1928. The paper of Ramsey which introduces Ramsey sentences (“Theories”) appeared posthumously several years later. When Russell reviewed The Foundations of Mathematics and other Logical Essays he seems not to have noticed the essay. Nonetheless, what Newman wrote regarding Russell’s theory bears on Ramsey’s view of theories, because Newman drew a contrast between the claim that a given relation has a certain structure — satisfies some condition - and the existential claim that some relation or other satisfies this condition. Newman observed that provided it is consistent, such an existential claim is true in any domain of sufficient cardinality. This however is not the case for claims regarding specific properties and relations. In the context of the classical Ramsey-sentence reconstruction of theories, one of the difficulties this poses is that a theory’s Ramsey sentence is true in any sufficiently large model of the O-sentences of the theory (sentences whose non-logical vocabulary consists entirely of O-terms). Hence the content of a theory in the sense of Ramsey coincides with the theory’s observational content together with a cardinality claim. The recent tradition of British structuralists (of which Cruse is an exponent) has sought to counter this objection, sometimes called “the Newman problem.” In my view, neither Cruse nor other members of this school have fully addressed the issues raised by Newman.

Let me begin by explaining Cruse’s strategy. As I noted, Cruse emphasizes that ramsification is relative to a choice of vocabulary. If one includes the mixed predicates within the choice of terms to ramsify, then the result is the same as if one neglected to distinguish a special category of mixed predicates. But if one leaves the mixed predicates constant, the Ramsey sentence that results is not one which holds in any sufficiently large model of the O-sentences for the simple reason that there is the additional requirement that what is claimed regarding the mixed properties and relations must also hold in any model of the Ramsey sentence. This is as much a condition for the truth of the Ramsey sentence as it is for the truth of the original (unramsified) theory. Cruse takes this observation to provide the basis for an answer to the Newman problem. But it is more accurately described as a reformulation of Ramsey’s view: according to Cruse the content of a theory is given by its O and mixed vocabulary sentences, not just its O-sentences.

It was part of Newman’s original observation that when predicates are treated as constants, assertions concerning them often express significant truths; a fortiori, this is true of assertions which treat mixed predicates as constants. Newman argued that this contrasts sharply with the case where such assertions are replaced by purely existential claims. What bearing does this have on a Ramsey-sentence reconstruction of assertions involving the T-vocabulary? Let me address this question by turning to Cruse’s claim to have shown how “to construct a counterexample to [Newman]” (p. 113). Briefly stated, I do not believe that Cruse has fully grasped the bearing of Newman’s observation on Ramsey’s theory in either its classical or revised form. This is evident from his discussion (on pp. 113f) of the Ramsey sentence

(§) fxy(fx fy contiguous(x, y) ~observable(x) ~observable(y)),

which Cruse introduces in order to illustrate the importance of mixed predicates for his analysis. Here, "contiguous(x, y)" is a mixed predicate which holds of both observable and unobservable entities. Cruse claims that in a domain in which no two unobservable entities are contiguous, (§) is false. But this is incorrect: (§) will be true — indeed, vacuously true - in a domain in which no unobservable entities are contiguous, since its matrix is satisfied when the variable f is assigned the empty property as its value. By contrast, consider the theory

(§§)xy(Tx Ty contiguous(x, y) ~observable(x) ~observable(y))

whose Ramsey sentence (§) may be taken to be. In a domain in which no unobservable entities are contiguous, (§§) will be false under any non-vacuous interpretation of the predicate T. By contrast, the variable f ranges over all properties associated with the field of subsets of the domain of individuals. Hence, so long as a false theory is merely satisfiable under a fixed interpretation of its O and mixed vocabulary, its Ramsey sentence will be true. The difference between the theory (§§) and its Ramsey sentence (§) is that (§) says only that there is some property or other which holds of x and y if and only if they are contiguous and unobservable. (§) may be true even though (§§) is false because (§§), unlike its Ramsey sentence, makes a claim about a specific property. But this is just Newman’s original observation applied to Ramsey’s view of theories as reformulated by Cruse, and so far as I can see, it is every bit as compelling against the reformulation as it was against the original.

By the way, the example of (§) goes some way toward explaining the appeal of supplementing the claim that a theory’s content is captured by its Ramsey sentence provided that the range of the new variables is restricted to “real” or “natural” relations. Aside from its vagueness, there are at least two difficulties with this proposal: First, by its very nature, it cannot address the fact that even “non-natural” or “unreal” relations can have significant claims made about them; and secondly, it fails to account for the fact that our unramsified assertions possess the significance they do without any apparent commitment to the notion of a “real” or “natural” relation.

Ramsey sentences and philosophical analysis: Jackson

I have only two brief comments to make on Jackson’s contribution, “Ramsey sentences and avoiding the sui generis.” The first is that the reader interested in learning what Jackson has to say about Ramsey sentences can go directly to the final section (XVII) of his paper, since it can be as well understood without as with the sixteen sections that precede it. This section (which is less than a page long) contains the whole of Jackson’s discussion of Ramsey sentences. Its central idea is the one announced in the section’s first paragraph:

Ramsey sentences tell us how having a place in a network can deliver an analysis in the sense of an account that reduces the number of unanalysable notions we have to admit in our account of what the world is like (p. 135).

To put things in perspective, let us recall just what Ramsey’s invention accomplished. Ramsey perceived that the role of the theoretical vocabulary in logical deductions depends only on its logical category; ramsification preserves this, since it replaces constants by new variables of the same type and arity. Hence also, the O-deductive content of the theoretical sentences — those composed wholly of T-terms and which Ramsey called “secondary propositions” — is preserved under ramsification. This is the point of the remark that "the incompleteness of the secondary propositions affects our disputes but not our reasoning" (Ramsey (1931 p. 232 and 1990 p. 132), my italics). But the difference between theories and their Ramsey sentences which emerged in our discussion of Cruse’s paper should make us skeptical of the idea that ramsification is the paradigm of a philosophical analysis of theoretical knowledge. Hence my second comment: in my view Jackson has greatly exaggerated what one might hope to extract from a simple technical idea.


Newman, M.H.A. 1928: “Mr Russell’s causal theory of perception,” Mind 37 pp. 137 — 148.

Potter, M. 2000: Reason’s nearest kin: Philosophies of arithmetic from Kant to Carnap, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Ramsey, F.P. [1925a]: “The foundations of mathematics,” reprinted in (Ramsey 1931) and (Ramsey 1990).

Ramsey, F.P. [1925b]: “Universals,” reprinted in (Ramsey 1931) and (Ramsey 1990).

Ramsey, F.P. 1926: “Note on the preceding paper,” in (Ramsey 1990); this paper is a partial reprinting of “Universals and the method of analysis,” Aristotelian Society Supplementary Volume (1926) 6 pp. 17 — 26.

Ramsey, F.P. 1929: “Theories,” in (Ramsey 1931) and (Ramsey 1990).

Ramsey, F.P. 1931: The foundations of mathematics and other logical essays, R. B. Braithwaite (ed.), London: Kegan Paul.

Ramsey, F.P. 1990: Philosophical papers, D.H. Mellor (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Russell, B. 1919: Introduction to mathematical philosophy, London: Allen and Unwin.

Russell, B. 1927: The Analysis of Matter, New York: Dover reprint of 1954.

Russell, B. 1931: "Review of F.P. Ramsey’s The foundations of mathematics and other logical essays, R. B. Braithwaite (ed.)," Mind 46 pp. 476 — 482.

Whitehead, A.N. and B. Russell 1925: Principia Mathematica, Volume 1, Second edition, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Wittgenstein, L. 1921: Tractatus logico-philosophicus, London: Kegan Paul.