Rational and Social Agency: The Philosophy of Michael Bratman

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Manuel Vargas and Gideon Yaffe (eds.), Rational and Social Agency: The Philosophy of Michael Bratman, Oxford University Press, 2014, 360pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199794515.

Reviewed by Sarah K. Paul, University of Wisconsin-Madison


All who take an interest in the contemporary philosophy of action should form a plan to read this excellent collection, or perhaps even a shared intention to assemble a reading group. Our very understanding of what it is to form a plan or shared intention is owed in no small part to Michael Bratman's massively influential body of work, and is further advanced by the eleven papers in this Festschrift. All the papers except J. David Velleman's are new. Bratman replies to each contributor and also gives a crisp statement of his current view on the relationship between planning agency, rationality, and normativity. The contributions fall naturally into thematic groups, in light of which I will briefly discuss each of them.

Rationality and Normativity

Kieran Setiya forcefully articulates a challenge for Bratman to explain the normative significance of the rational requirements on intention. Bratman has defended a view of rationality on which one is rationally forbidden (a) to intend an end without intending the means believed necessary for that end, (b) to have intentions that are believed to be mutually inconsistent, and (c) to abandon an intention while continuing to believe that it is adequately supported by one's reasons. The challenge is to explain why we should care about conforming to what rationality requires -- what reason do we have to conform in every case to which these requirements apply? Setiya rightly points out that it will not suffice to cite the general pragmatic benefits of being disposed to be rational, because there will be particular cases in which those benefits are absent. And we should resist the temptation of supposing that if we have sufficient reason to engage in the general practice of being rational, we ipso facto have reason to be rational at every opportunity; this would be "rule worship."

Setiya argues that the only way for Bratman to meet the challenge is to go in for a comprehensive form of what he terms 'rationalism', according to which the rational requirements are grounded in the standards of what it is to be a good agent. On this kind of view, the normative significance of being irrational is that one is failing at agency itself. But the flaw in Planning-Theory-based Rationalism, Setiya warns, is that it rules out the possibility that moral reasons are universal. Start with the assumption that the nature of ideal practical rationality is exhausted by what it is to be good qua agent. If it is a defect of practical rationality to be unmoved by a consideration that is a reason for you, and of which you are aware, then it follows from this assumption that it must be a defect of agency. However, it is not essential to being a planning agent that one be disposed to be motivated by the needs and interests of others. It is therefore no defect of agency to be unmoved by moral reasons, and so, according to the Rationalist, no defect of practical rationality. The claim is that if Bratman were to ground the normative significance of the coherence, consistency, and stability requirements in the nature of agency, then all facts about ideal practical rationality must be grounded in the same way -- and categorical moral reasons will not make the cut.

I suggest that those who are sympathetic to Planning-Agency Rationalism can escape the argument in a different way, however: by rejecting the premise that ideal practical rationality is concerned solely with good agency. In defense of this claim, Setiya appeals only to the intuition that judgments of practical rationality are assessments of us as agents, and not some other aspect of our lives (68). This intuition is compelling if 'practical rationality' is read narrowly, as being concerned with consistency and effectiveness, but that is not how Setiya intends the term -- he means it to be understood in the widest sense, in which ideal rationality entails responsiveness to any reason one in fact has (barring factual ignorance). It is far from obvious that any failure to respond to a consideration that is a reason must be understood as a failure of agency as such. If this assumption is rejected, the possibility opens up that the categorical normative demands on us admit of multiple explanations. Perhaps the consistency, coherence, and stability requirements are grounded in the nature of planning agency, while the categorical moral reasons are grounded in facts about the virtuous person, or the flourishing human being, or in the objective moral facts. Setiya might implicitly object to the idea that there could be more than one "source" of normativity; for one thing, it would generate a further question about how these disparate normative pressures are to be reconciled deliberatively into an all-things-considered 'ought'. But nothing in Bratman's view prevents the friend of both rationalism and categorical moral reasons from going this route.[1]

Christine Korsgaard, also charges the Planning Theory with being insufficiently normative. Her paper is a welcome effort to articulate the important differences between her view of agency as defended in Self-Constitution and views in the Davidsonian tradition, including Bratman's. The crucial difference, she claims, is that the latter kind of view is "naturalistic," in that it takes actions to be identifiable in terms of the causal pathway leading up to them. In contrast, the "normative" conception holds that the capacity for agency depends on the existence of certain normative relations, and that the status of an event as an action depends upon conformity with those relations -- on her view, the Kantian Categorical and Hypothetical Imperatives. Korsgaard argues that a merely causal story about how intentions are formed and lead to action could never amount to an agent making something happen; indeed, the causal story would seem to find no fault with a case in which a neuroscientist had implanted a given intention (200). She adds that we cannot even make sense of the idea that mental states like belief and intention could exist and play their assigned causal role prior to being governed by the norms of rationality. It is only by aiming for self-determination, and conforming to the Kantian imperatives for that reason, that we unify our mental activity and thereby constitute ourselves both as thinkers and as agents.

While there are proponents of the kind of causal theory of action that Korsgaard takes as her target, I do not think that either Davidson or Bratman falls into that category. Davidson could not agree more that the realm of the mental is essentially normative, while Bratman has argued extensively that the state of intention is in part defined by the fact that it is subject to rational norms. And neither is a proponent of the view that being caused in the right way is sufficient for being an action, unless one builds a great deal of normative content into what it is to be caused 'in the right way'. On Davidson's view, the belief-desire pair that causes an action must also rationalize it, while Bratman's view requires the presence of substantial psychological structure that largely obeys the consistency, coherence, and stability requirements before the guidance of an intention amounts to an agent's governance. The real bone of contention, I think, is not whether agency is in general normatively constituted, but whether particular exercises of agency must be conceived of by the agent as falling under the Categorical Imperative or any other principle of choiceworthiness.

Normativity and Identification

Geoffrey Sayre-McCord, Michael Smith, and R. Jay Wallace challenge Bratman's account of what it is to identify with certain of one's attitudes in a way that endows them with the authority to "speak for" oneself. Sayre-McCord and Smith  acknowledge that there might be multiple notions of identification that are philosophically interesting, but suggest that there is a distinctive kind of identification that is associated with autonomy. On their view, autonomy requires that the beliefs, desires, and intentions on which the agent acts are appropriately sensitive both to the reasons she has, and to her normative judgment that the objects of her desires are in fact good (148). Similarly, Wallace maintains that identification necessarily involves the belief that one has good reason to act on the desires with which one is identified. In contrast, on Bratman's "volitionalist" account, it is sufficient that one has a plan-like commitment with which one is satisfied to treat certain considerations as reason-giving in deliberation. He concedes that the functional role of identification can be played by a normative judgment, but denies that any such judgment is necessary.

Sayre-McCord and Smith argue for their normative conception of autonomy by asking us to imagine an agent who meets all the non-cognitive conditions for identifying with a desire, but who believes that her desire would not withstand rational scrutiny. The intuition, they claim, is that she does not truly value the object of the desire, and so would not be autonomous in acting on it (147). This claim is plausible as far as it goes, but the argument mistakenly excludes the middle ground in which the agent lacks a belief either way concerning the comparative value of those things she has committed to. And I take it that cases involving the withholding of normative judgment are what Bratman has most centrally in mind. His chief aim is to accommodate the fact that we frequently face choices in our lives that are normatively underdetermined, or at least normatively uncertain, in that reasonable people will assign the options different values or find those values to be incomparable. The job of identification is in part to construct a set of commitments that will overcome this kind of underdetermination. At most, Sayre-McCord and Smith's argument shows that autonomous identification is inconsistent with a negative normative judgment, not that it requires a positive one.

Wallace challenges the conviction that normative underdetermination is widespread, arguing that even if our options are sometimes equal or incommensurable with respect to value, we still usually have conclusive reason for a particular choice deriving from our interests, emotional vulnerabilities, and talents. If there is generally a determinate answer concerning what we have most reason to do, then there is no obstacle to supposing that the job of constructing a life out of a multiplicity of valuable options could be done cognitively rather than volitionally. However, his argument depends on characterizing incommensurable choices as involving a "Buridan-like tie" (116). This way of depicting incommensurability leads naturally to the supposition that further facts about our proclivities and talents can act as tie-breakers. But if many of our options are genuinely incomparable or "on a par" rather than merely tied, adding further reasons in favor of one option over the others will not necessarily resolve the question of what to do. After all, if the value of a life of public service cannot be compared with the value of a life focused on one's family, the fact that I am better at and get more enjoyment out of public service does not suddenly make it clear that I should be an absentee parent to my child.

A second problem is that even if Wallace is correct that I can resolve such impasses by judging that a public career is the best option for a person of my proclivities, it might still be that I should not. For in judging that my choice is correct, I am thereby committed to viewing others who make a different choice given the same options and proclivities as mistaken. In defense of this implication, Wallace points out that even pluralistic, liberal societies do in fact exhibit entrenched normative disagreement about the fundamental value of life options, and that cognitivism is consistent with this fact (121). But as I see the appeal of Bratman's volitionalist alternative, the point is that it does not have to be this way; if I can build a life that I see as fully my own without thereby taking my choices to be superior to those of people who have gone a different route, this would seem to be a preferable expression of mutual respect and humility.

In my view, a better case for the importance of normative judgment is implicit in Elijah Millgram's "Segmented Agency" (though he does not himself put it this way). This is one of the richest and most provocative papers in the collection, posing a deep-seated challenge to the value of the kind of unified, psychologically continuous, plan- and policy-governed agency that Bratman takes to be central to our lives. Millgram points out that a stable network of plans and policies is only possible or useful in an environmental niche that is itself stable and unsurprising, but that most agents do not occupy such a niche for their entire lives. Rather, we periodically shift from one niche to another, or straddle several at once, sometimes because we recognize that our current set of policies is "wrong all the way down." At the center of the paper is a vivid example of an agent whose life is structured around academia, but who decides to abandon his academic career to escape Nazi Germany. The challenge to the Planning Theory is that Millgram thinks we "segmented" agents are sometimes most autonomous and self-governing when we are dissatisfied with our policies and opt to abandon them wholesale, and that Bratman's understanding of policy-guided self-governance cannot accommodate this point.

Millgram's essay is a healthy reminder of the complexity of human agency that undeniably becomes obscured by idealized models. That said, it will not do to rest entirely on the intuition that the German academic is autonomous in abandoning his current set of plans and policies; the central question of action theory asks in virtue of what an event is a self-governed action. Millgram gestures toward a view on which self-governance can be a matter of the world guiding us, via signals we get from the environment in the form of excitement, frustration, and boredom (173-74). However, we surely do not want to include just any case of first-personally inexplicable, environment-driven response to count as autonomous agency. In his "Replies," Bratman addresses this lacuna in Millgram's suggestion by doubling down on the need for some very high-level plan-like commitment to guide these radical transitions if they are to count as self-government (325). But I suggest that at least some of Millgram's cases might be better dealt with by allowing that a normative judgment rather than a plan must do the needed work. Perhaps it is in actively making a fundamental break with the past that there is a unique role to play for the judgment that one has been getting it wrong, or that one's policies are no longer fitting, and that a new approach in a different setting would be in some respect better.

Intention and Belief

A fundamental commitment of Bratman's approach is its resistance to assimilating intention to belief, or practical rationality to theoretical rationality. On his view, intentions are sui generis practical attitudes that are not reducible to beliefs, desires, or some combination thereof. They are rationally incompatible with the belief that one will not do as one intends, but do not entail the belief that one will. The contributions of Velleman and Richard Holton each challenge this commitment to keeping the practical and theoretical realms distinct. Velleman argues that Bratman's modal separation of intention and belief creates an explanatory gap, for if an agent need not believe she will do what she intends, there is no explanation for why her intentions should be mutually consistent and means-end coherent. Velleman's own well-known explanation is that intentions just are a kind of doxastic attitude, and therefore subject to the requirements of theoretical rationality.

In a refreshing twist on Velleman's cognitivism about intention, Holton  explores the hypothesis that beliefs are more like intentions than the other way around. Holton defends two distinct theses: that credences are not psychologically real, and that the all-out beliefs we do operate with are governed in part by pragmatic considerations. He argues for these claims in tandem, but it is possible to accept either one without the other. In favor of the latter claim, Holton draws on Bratman's 'design' argument for intention: that cognitively limited creatures like us have need of the attitude of all-out intention to end deliberation, filter our options down to a tractable number, and resist wasteful reconsideration. Holton suggests that considerations of cognitive limitation render us in need of doxastic attitudes that aid us in a similar way. We cannot and should not try to keep track of all the various probabilities or update on each new piece of evidence; beliefs should settle doxastic deliberation even when we are not certain, and resist reconsideration even in the face of new evidence, because we need to be able to move forward in our investigations and act on our conclusions. Holton's proposal, I take it, is not merely that these are practical reasons to be epistemically irrational, but rather that epistemic rationality should be directly informed by such practical considerations.

Holton takes these points to weigh against Bayesian epistemology, in that such approaches model thinkers as operating with relatively fine-grained credences rather than all-out beliefs and emphasize updating rather than stability. I am not convinced that this challenge lands a heavy blow, since there is no one view that counts as Bayesianism. There are many different ways of spelling out the details of this kind of approach, with room for varying degrees of commitment to realism about credences and to the need for fixed points that play the roles Holton assigns to belief. But while I think the Bayesian need not be uniquely troubled by the challenge, the positive proposal is a powerful and intriguing one.

Shared Agency

Two of the essays address Bratman's theory of shared agency: of what it is to act together. The juxtaposition of Margaret Gilbert's and Scott Shapiro's papers illustrates the curious amount of disagreement in the shared-agency literature concerning what the target of explanation is: Gilbert contends that Bratman's view is too weak, while Shapiro argues that it is too strong. Bratman's own stated aim is to account for what he calls "modest sociality," or the shared intentional activities of small groups with no asymmetric power relations and in which the participants remain constant. His account of these phenomena is individualistic, in the sense that it involves no commitment to irreducibly plural subjects with irreducible group-intentions. Rather, shared intentions consist of individual intentions with plural content, in conjunction with common knowledge of these intentions. We share an intention to J if I intend that we J in accordance with and because of our meshing subplans, you intend the same, and we each know that this is so.

Gilbert's major critique is familiar from past work: on her view, sharing an intention or acting together essentially involves a kind of non-moral mutual obligation for each party to do his or her part, and Bratman's account does not vindicate this normative claim. This paper elaborates on the relations between mutual obligation, agreements, and claim-rights, proposing that if X is obligated to Y to f, Y has a claim-right against X and has the standing to demand of X that she f. Gilbert's thesis is that these relations are best explained by the correct understanding of what it is to make an agreement. On her view, to have made an agreement with another to f is to be jointly committed to endorsing as a body the plan to f (234-35). This joint commitment suffices both to produce a joint intention and to bring mutual obligations and claim-rights into existence.

It is possible, I think, to agree with much of Gilbert's attractive picture concerning the nature of agreements and the obligations they generate without accepting the further thesis that agreements necessarily issue in a joint intention. The latter claim is defended by appeal to how counterintuitive it would be for me to have made an agreement with you, e.g., to have dinner together, only to deny that we had thereby made a plan (228). But Gilbert later remarks that a joint commitment to a plan has implications only for how the parties ought to act, and not how they are personally to plan (233). This suggests that the notion of 'plan' Gilbert has in mind is not meant to play a central role in explaining how shared activities are successfully realized, and that room is therefore left open for a further story about the individual psychological states that do play this explanatory role. And once we are committed to the distinct existences of both social, normatively-laden plans and individualistic, non-normative, explanatory ones, it is to be expected that the two would extensionally diverge in a way that leaves something for both Bratman and Gilbert to explain.

The disagreement between Bratman and Shapiro is more worrisome. Shapiro asks how Bratman's account of modest sociality could be extended to account for shared activities involving very large groups in which there are asymmetrical power relations and "alienated" members. He concedes that the view can accommodate asymmetrical authority, since in these cases the parties still have plural intentions to act together by way of having meshing subplans; the difference authority makes lies in whether meshing can be achieved through giving orders rather than negotiating. However, Shapiro argues that the account cannot be straightforwardly extended to alienated group participation, where individual parties are not committed to the success of the joint activity. An employee of a corporation might intentionally do his part, and thus participate with the other employees in a shared corporate activity, without in any way being committed to the overall goal of the activity. To address this possibility, Shapiro proposes that shared agency can be realized without shared plural intentions: it requires only that each participant intentionally follow her part of a shared plan and resolve any conflicts with other members in a peaceful and open manner, where this is common knowledge (277).

In his reply, Bratman defends his own emphasis on stronger forms of shared agency by appeal to the central philosophical interest of questions about the continuity (or discontinuity) between individual agency and social agency. For him, the dominant question is whether there is some point at which we must introduce new metaphysical, conceptual, and normative resources to account for joint activity that are not present in individual agency. But Shapiro might counter that investigations into the nature of sociality are also centrally interested in continuity between different instantiations of social activity, and in whether there is a minimal framework on which we can build to explain not only walking together, but working in huge corporations together, participating in political institutions together, and creating and enforcing a legal system together. This brand of continuity also seems to have theoretical importance. Perhaps it would help to shore up the relative centrality of Bratman's target phenomenon to argue that it is connected to other important notions, such as the conditions of attributability and responsibility. It is plausible that the kind of unalienated sociality that requires a shared intention is at least more tightly related to a shared action counting as something that a participant did, and is fully responsible for, than is serving as an alienated instrument of someone else's plan.

Finally, Alfred Mele returns to a classic debate over implications of the adverb 'intentionally'. He presents the results of a set of surveys first published in Mele and Cushman (2008) showing that the lay folk as well as the philosophers are divided over whether side effects of intentional actions are themselves brought about intentionally, and reflects candidly on the theoretical motivations that might underlie his own past disagreement with Bratman on the proper use of the adverb. Mele, like all the other contributors, illustrates the unflagging interest and enjoyment in the philosophical conversations that Bratman's work has generated, and will no doubt continue to generate for a long time to come.


My thanks to the "Rational and Social Agency" reading group at UW-Madison, especially Mike Titelbaum, Clinton Packman, and Ben Schwan.

[1] For more on this possibility, see the exchange between Bratman and Setiya in Analysis 69(3), 2009.