Rational Belief: Structure, Grounds, and Intellectual Virtue

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Robert Audi, Rational Belief: Structure, Grounds, and Intellectual Virtue, Oxford University Press, 2015, 281pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780190221836.

Reviewed by Mark Leon, University of the Witwatersrand


This is a collection of Robert Audi's previously published papers that focus on belief and rationality. The book has four sections. Part I focuses on belief mainly from the perspective of the philosophy of mind. It looks at the nature of belief, its relation to the will as well as the important issue of the nature of belief content in relation to the internalist-externalist debate. Part II focuses on more traditional epistemological issues, with normativity being central. It looks at normativity with respect to the perception of moral properties, considers reliability as an intellectual virtue and examines the way in which epistemology can be considered as normative. Part III has a central focus on Audi's internalist account of justification applied across a number of areas and contrasted with his endorsement of an externalist account of knowledge. Part IV considers the more social (as opposed to individual) aspects of believing and knowing with the primary focus on testimony, which plays such a central role in the beliefs we form and the knowledge we gain. The collection closes with a discussion of rational disagreement.

The book is extensive in its coverage, dense in its arguments, full of important and instructive distinctions and constitutes an enormously valuable contribution to the philosophical study of belief across a number of dimensions. What links the fairly disparate elements together is the focus on belief and Audi's distinctive combination of internalism and externalism in both the philosophy of mind and epistemology. In the following, I will focus on certain essays. It is impossible to cover all in a review of this kind.

Part I examines in sequence the structure of belief, its relation to the will and the nature of belief content. In Chapter 1, Audi distinguishes on the one side, occurrent beliefs from dispositional ones, and on the other, beliefs (occurrent and dispositional) and the disposition to believe. There is a distinction between the beliefs that we are aware of or that are in the agent's mind, like the belief that there is a computer before me now, and dispositional beliefs, beliefs that we have but are not occurrent, like my belief that the computer has a qwerty key board. The latter sort of belief would become manifest in behavior, verbal or otherwise, under appropriate conditions. The more significant distinction is between such beliefs and the disposition to believe. The disposition to believe is a readiness to form a belief that one does not yet have, under appropriate conditions. The distinction between dispositional beliefs and a disposition to believe "is in part that between accessibility of a proposition by a retrieval process that draws on memory and its accessibility only through a belief formation process" (p.13).

The disposition to believe can be realized in a number of ways including by having the thought of the relevant proposition. The grounds of the disposition include other beliefs the subject has, as well as perceptual, introspective and memorial experiences. And the disposition in turn is manifested in belief formation. There are, for example, presumably infinitely many beliefs we could form about, for example, the relation between the various numbers, but most of these are not beliefs we are currently aware of, nor realistically beliefs that we possess dispositionally. They are beliefs we are disposed to form when we come to think about or reflect upon them. Audi's account offers an economical and elegant way of accounting for these phenomena. It allows for cutting down the number of beliefs that we would normally be tempted to ascribe to a subject.

How, it might be asked, is a disposition to believe different from the capacity to form (any other) belief we could come to hold? Audi's response is that with a disposition to believe a (causal) basis for belief is already present so that the proposition need only be thought of in order to be believed. More work needs to be done on this distinction, but the point seems a valuable one.

Chapter 2, 'Doxastic Voluntarism and the Ethics of Belief', concerns the important relation between belief and the will. Audi's position is that while beliefs are not under our direct positive voluntary control, they are under indirect voluntary control, both positive and negative, and, he adds, under special conditions may be under direct negative control.

One focus in this paper is comparison of reasons for belief (theoretical reasons) and reasons for actions (practical reasons). Whereas beliefs have a mind to world direction of fit (beliefs to be true need to fit the world), desires have a world to mind direction of fit (for desires to be realized the world needs to fit in with them). And whereas the function of the will is to change the world in the direction of a desired state of affairs, the function of belief is to provide a true representation of the world. As Audi points out, while practical reasons point to acts, theoretical reasons point to true propositions. What is indicated is a difference in causation. Desires produce changes in the world, while beliefs are changed to reflect the way the world is. One reason he puts forward for rejecting the (direct) voluntarist account of belief is that beliefs are not actions, though they could be the result of actions. As he says, "action and belief formation are responses to different kinds of reasons: those appropriate to beliefs are not reasons for actions at all" (p.40).

While I think Audi's overall position in rejecting the voluntarist account is correct, three points are worth making. Firstly, the suggestion is that though beliefs are not under our direct voluntary control they can nonetheless be under our indirect control. I think this formulation is problematic. 'Control' suggests a tracking relationship, but there is no reason to think that there is such a systematic relationship between beliefs and our actions. What is correct is that things we do can indirectly affect what we believe, but what we believe remains (at least standardly) a function of the evidence. Beliefs track the evidence or the reasons there are rather than what we do. That leads to the second point. Greater stress should be given to the truth- or evidence-tracking nature of belief in taking on the voluntarist conception. If not quite anchored in the truth, beliefs are those states that are (at least standardly) evidence- or reason-tracking. That is their function. Were it possible for the will to play a more direct role, it would not only lack guidance -- as to what to believe -- it would interfere with the proper function of the belief system. And this leads to the third point, a truth- or reason-tracking account of freedom (or autonomy) of belief: A subject believes freely or autonomously when her beliefs follow or are formed in the light of or because of the evidence or reason. A subject's freedom or autonomy is infringed when her beliefs are manipulated, when produced say, by indoctrination or brain-washing or by manipulation or by withholding of evidence . . . when produced in the wrong way.

Audi concludes the chapter with a discussion of the ethics of belief. Given the indirect role that subjects have in the formation of their beliefs, room obtains for an ethics of belief. As he stresses, we have epistemic obligations including being "properly attentive both to logic . . . and to the evidence of our senses, memory, consciousness and reflection" (p.43). There are things that we can do indirectly that will help to ensure that the beliefs we form are better warranted by the evidence or reason. And accordingly, there are intellectual or epistemic virtues that we can cultivate in parallel to the moral virtues.

Audi exhibits the distinction between theoretical and practical reason very well by noting that if the intellect were not independent of the will "we as rational agents could not do as well as we do" (p.46). To change the world "we need a realistic map of it, and as a guide to practical reason that map cannot be drawn at our pleasure" (p.46). Our success in navigating the world depends on our representations (generally) being true, whether or not what is so represented is desired.

Chapter 3 primarily focuses on the nature of belief content and provides a nuanced discussion of the different kinds of belief and belief attribution. It considers externalist and internalist accounts of content and looks at the implications for justification. A major question is whether an externalist account of content requires an externalist epistemology, particularly applied to justification, or whether it would be compatible with an internalist account of justification.

Audi distinguishes between predicative believing, believing to be, or believing of something and propositional believing, believing that something is the case. The former are objectual, de re beliefs, the latter are characterized as de dicto beliefs. Whereas the latter involves some conceptualization both of the subject of belief as well as of what is predicated of it, the latter requires conceptualization only of the predicated property.

With the externalists, Audi argues that what our beliefs are about is a matter of our causal situation in the world. Hence identical subjects in different worlds will have beliefs with different content. But he departs from a pure form of externalism in arguing that the propositional content of what we believe "is a matter of internal intellectual constitution" (p.66). Audi provides the beginning of a "property-ascription theory of narrow content" (p.59). The narrow content can comprise not what the belief is about, but what the subject believes about it. So while the content of the belief of twin-worlders differ with respect to what their beliefs are about -- say, water or twater -- they can still have beliefs with the same predicative content, say believing respectively that water or twater is refreshing.

While the account is not presented as a fully-developed theory, it does face challenges since the question needs to be asked as to how the predicative content accrues. Consider a subject in this world and her brain-in-a-vat twin in a world lacking water or any other liquid to which 'refreshing' could be attributed. What would be the shared content in this case? The same considerations that lead to differential content in different worlds would suggest a difference in content in this case too.

As indicated, a major focus of Audi's concern is with the relation between an externalist account of content and an internalist account of justification. He argues that the two are compatible. This position would gain some support if a notion of narrow content were available. The idea would be that though beliefs may have an external content in virtue of what they are about, "what justifies our ascribing a property to something (or to some apparent thing) is internal" (p.61). As long as there is common narrow content that is internally accessible, an externalist account of content is compatible with an internalist account of justification. The defensibility of this claim in part depends on the availability of a notion of narrow content (which as seen can be questioned). But Audi goes on to suggest that even on an externalist account of content, as long as this content is accessible to the agent, an internalist account of justification would be compatible with an externalist account of content.

There is some reason for thinking on an externalist account that the content would be internally accessible -- content could filter through depending on context. But this in turn would raise a different problem turning on the nature of justification, in particular whether a defensible internalist account of justification is available -- a point to be taken up again later.

Part II focuses on normativity and virtue in epistemology. It begins with a discussion of moral perception and knowledge. Audi argues that moral properties are perceivable in a similar way to 'higher-order' properties like anger. He argues irrespective of whether moral properties are themselves causal, moral perception is causally explicable in virtue of moral properties being consequential on certain base properties which are causal. So we can perceive, say, the injustice of theft by observing the seizure of someone's wallet. Admittedly, to see the event as an instance of an injustice (and hence to be in a position to come to believe that it is an instance of justice) is to have the appropriate concepts, but that point is applicable to other perceptible properties too.

The account of moral knowledge offered is built on the account of moral perception. Audi characterizes his account as a 'phenomenological reliabilism' paralleling reliabilist accounts of knowledge elsewhere. This provides for a kind of ethical objectivity -- "the availability of intersubjectively accessible grounds for a wide range of moral judgments" (p.83).

While having much sympathy with this account, I have a number of concerns. First, as Audi recognizes, perception has a phenomenal or phenomenological element to it -- there is something that it is like to perceive an object or property. More needs to be said about what this feature is like in the case of perceiving moral properties. What does the phenomenal character of moral perception comprise? Second, while Audi maintains that his account is neutral with respect to whether moral properties are naturalisable, this can be questioned. For the account to work, moral properties must be suitably dependent on non-moral properties, as he says they are "constitutively anchored in natural properties". What this suggests is a form of supervenience, but wouldn't such a supervenient or constitutive relation entail a form of (non-reductive) naturalization? Third, again as he notes, an account like this owes an explanation of the evident greater moral disagreement compared to disagreement with respect to the perception of more basic perceptual properties. His major response to this is to note that just as "quite rational persons differ in aesthetic and perceptual sensitivity, they differ in moral sensitivity and may disagree as a result" even when observing the same events (p.83). There are parallels but arguably there are greater differences with at least the more clearly objective perceptual case, calling for more to be said in defense of the moral case.

Chapter 5 considers reliability as a virtue. Audi argues that if reliability is to be seen as an intellectual virtue it requires not merely (generally) getting things right, something that can be done by an idiot savant or logic machine, but (generally) getting things right for the right reason, being responsive for example to the grounds of justification, namely, perception, consciousness (introspection), memory and reason. What is stressed is the role of the will, not in believing at will, but in doing other things at will that would enhance one's capacity to get things right, by reflecting on one's perceptions, memory, reasoning and so on. Reliability as an intellectual virtue is accordingly a trait of the person, not merely of say a cognitive sub-component of the person. And the concept of a trait as a virtue is normative for Audi in that it is a (or not merely a) non-instrumental good.

The section concludes with a discussion of the 'normativity' of epistemology. Audi distinguishes between analytical epistemology, which is concerned with the analysis of knowledge and justification, and normative epistemology, which is concerned with the "standards for deciding what we do or do not know, or are or are not justified in believing" (p.99). While he considers the possibility of naturalizing the former positively, his judgement is more negative on the possibility of naturalizing the latter. He makes the important distinction between being normative in content and normative in upshot. Certain states like being in pain or having certain experiences are not normative in content but can be normative in upshot in that being in pain provides a reason to take 'palliative action', and having a certain experience provides a (prima facie) reason for believing (the world is the way the experience represents it as being). This distinction suggests a way in which normative properties (like being justified) can be grounded in non-normative properties whether or not they are reducible to them.

Part III, which focuses on Epistemological Internalism and the grounds of justification and knowledge, begins with a defense of an internalist theory of normative grounds. According to the theory, "what justifies a belief, i.e., the grounds of its justification, is something internal to the subject" (p.121), where by 'internal' is meant "that to which one has access by introspection or reflection" (p.121). For Audi, as for other internalists, there is a close connection between one's belief being justified and having a justification for one's belief, one's being able to justify the belief (by citing the reason or ground for the belief).

Most importantly and unusually, Audi's internalism with respect to justification contrasts with his externalism with respect to knowledge. For him, as for other externalists (about knowledge), knowledge is taken to be (typically) grounded in the external; knowledge depends on reliability, depends on our beliefs being reliably produced, being produced by a mechanism that produces beliefs that are mostly true. However, whether a belief has been produced by a reliable mechanism is not something which is internally accessible. An agent and her brain-in-a-vat counterpart could be in exactly the same (qualitatively identical) state and yet (on one version of the tale) only the agent in this world has beliefs that are true, that are reliably produced. Clearly there is a basis here for treating the two alike in certain respects for going on what is accessible, one could not differentiate between the two in terms of, say, praise or blame for believing what they do.

According to Audi's compatibilist account, while knowledge "is known on the basis of grounds that are not (at least not all) accessible" (p.127), by contrast what one is justified in believing is determined by internally accessible states or processes. Importantly, Audi thinks there can be knowledge without justification, as with the idiot savant who gets things right but can cannot provide any justification for his beliefs.

As innovative and interesting as this compromise between internalism and externalism is, it is problematic. There is reason to think that the key to justification is its connection with truth. We are justified, if we are, in believing that the world is as our experience represents it as being because experiences of that sort are typically veridical. Were they not -- as in one version of the brain-in-the-vat case -- we would not be justified in believing on the basis of our experience no matter how blameless we would be. We are justified in believing that p on the basis of the belief that q because the truth of the belief that q would increase the likelihood of the belief that p being true. If the connection between belief and truth is severed, as could be the case on the internalist account, the connection between blamelessness and justification would also be severed. As indicated earlier there is a temptation, correctly recognized by internalists, to think that identical states would give rise reasonably to identical beliefs (all other things being equal). But at best this might be said to captures a notion of 'subjective' rather than 'objective' justification, where the former is in some sense (not to be spelt out here) parasitic on the latter.

Audi also offers an internalist account of justification in the theory of action. As with justified beliefs, justified and rational action (as a sub-category of intentional action) are taken to require "access to adequate normative grounds for them" where "access must be to a normatively adequate ground, one that justifies, or at least renders rational, the belief or action based on it" (p.134).

Again, one can question features of this account. What is much clearer is that in the case of agency and action, as we would expect, we (typically) have access to the reasons that motivate us; what is less clear is that we have access to whether the reasons that motivate us also justify our actions in the objective sense of doing what is objectively right as opposed to what we take to be right. What might be internally accessible are our reasons for acting, but what is suggested is that what is not internally accessible is whether those reasons objectively justify our actions.

Chapter 8 focuses on the nature of theoretical rationality, the aim of which is to seek a true representation of the world. As seen, Audi identifies the sources of rationality as perception, memory, consciousness (or introspection) and reason. Perception and consciousness, unlike memory, are taken to be basic sources of knowledge in that they are not, unlike memory, dependent on other sources. Audi also identifies testimony as a (non-basic) source of many of our rational beliefs. He accords an important role to coherence but not as a basic source of justification; rather, he takes incoherence to defeat justification. That coherence accompanies rational and justified beliefs is not taken to show that it is a positive source of justification, but rather the suggestion is that justification being grounded in its sources brings coherence with it.

Chapter 9 focuses on the question of whether beliefs by their very nature are rational 'unless proven guilty' and the thesis of 'Phenomenal Conservatism' that if it seems to one that p then then in the absence of defeaters, one has some degree of justification for believing that p (see Huemer, 2006). He looks at whether the former can be supported by the latter. While he endorses a qualified version of the former, as applied to 'rational persons', he rejects an unqualified version of the latter, arguing for a more restricted version of phenomenal conservatism, a restricted foundationalist view. He takes the justification of belief to be 'conferred' by the basic grounds of justification. Seemings in turn may "be based on such grounds . . . and will then imply some degree of justification" (p.187). So on the account, seemings while not not sufficient for justification nonetheless have a critical role to play.

The discussion though instructive is one that would be mainly of interest to internalists who already recognize the general category of seemings, which extend beyond the experiential cases. Those less sympathetic to this view will have less interest in the discussion, though they could have equal interest in one of the core issues, namely whether beliefs are by their nature rational. As Davidson has argued in a number of places, there is much that can be said in favour of this thesis not related to phenomenal conservativism.

Part IV focuses on Social Epistemology. A central issue concerns testimony, which plays such a crucial role in the acquisition of beliefs and knowledge. Unlike some other sources of knowledge, like perception, testimony is not basic since it is based on another source, namely perception. However though not a basic source it is, according to Audi, a "source of basic knowledge" (p.241) in that it is not inferentially based on other knowledge. With testimony, the default mode, is an attitude of credulity. We believe others unless we have reason not to. This is an important, and I think, sustainable position. The section ends with a discussion of rational disagreement attempting to explain how that is possible.

This collection is not an easy read. But it is most certainly a worthwhile one. Audi has a distinctive position, if not on all issues, then in the way in which they are put together, as evinced by his endorsement of an internalist account of justification and an externalist account of knowledge. There is much here that is instructive, illuminating, provocative and worthy of considered response.


Huemer, Michael, 2006. 'Phenomenal Conservatism and the Internalist Intuition'. American Philosophical Quarterly, 43, pp.147-158.