Rational Causation

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Eric Marcus, Rational Causation, Harvard University Press, 2012, 266pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674059900.

Reviewed by James A. Montmarquet, Tennessee State University


In this ambitious, challenging study, Eric Marcus critiques or otherwise molds to his own original purposes much work in the philosophy of mind, action, causation, and in the ontology of events and states, spanning the period from The Concept of Mind to the present. I mention Ryle, for what emerges is a kind of synthesis, whose thesis would be the dichotomy of reasons and causes emanating from him, the later Wittgenstein, and those "little red books" (149); and whose antithesis would be Davidson's effort to bring reasons, causes, and a covering law model of the latter under one tent. On Marcus's rational causation view, reasons for action are causes -- but of a sui generis, non-efficient variety. In the end, rational causation, as a distinctively mental ability, becomes the basis for his rejection of current physicalist positions.

But, to begin, let us note that "rational causation" -- whether of belief or action -- is, in the first instance, representational. Where X is the rational cause of Y, one represents Y as 'to be believed' on account of X's having this same status; alternatively, one represents Y as 'to be done' on account of X's having this status (66, 111). In thus representing this relation, one is able to say -- without observation or other evidence -- what one believes or is doing -- and why (66,167). This importantly distinguishes (117, 138) human action from the more limited reasons responsiveness of lower creatures (the subject of chapter three). This inward-looking, Anscombe-inspired side of rational caution, however, has its outer correlate: when this rational ability is successfully exercised, the reasons one gives are normally states of the world, not of one's own mind (103). When Dara is said to be "tasting all the desserts because she is reviewing the restaurant," her reason pertains to the state of her employment, not her mind. Should Dara unknowingly have been discharged from her position, we may retreat to the level of belief (she "thought" that she was reviewing the restaurant), but rational abilities, Marcus insists (15, 67, 169), are best understood in successful cases.

If Anscombe's account of action, reasons, and self-knowledge in Intention is the most important building block of Marcus's theory, Davidson's position (especially in "Actions, Reasons, and Causes") is its main target. Against the latter, he urges, first, that Davidson misconstrues his opposition as supposing that citing a justification for an action is "by itself a way of explaining an action" (152, his emphasis). More tellingly, he seizes (158f) on what is at least an awkward feature of the Davidson account: ultimately we are assured that a reasons explanation is causal only by a notion that one's reason -- or some event associated with it, under a physical description probably unknown to one -- instantiates a law of nature, probably also unknown. On the rational cause doctrine, reasons are causes in a more immediate way. Dara's causal knowledge, in the previous example, has to do with her recognition of the rational connection between these representations: that I am to review the restaurant, that I am to taste all of the desserts.

For their part, however, Davidsonians may fire back that, in dispensing with a nomologically based causal nexus underlying one's representations, we now lack the very thing that Davidson chided the Ryleans for lacking: an assured distinction between causal explanation and mere possible justification. That she is to review the restaurant would justify Dara, but (arguably) this is only the right (causal) explanation if we can eliminate, say, Dara's sweet tooth as the real cause. The Ryleans (pace Marcus) may not have been guilty of equating explanation and mere justification, but the question remains whether they were able, or Marcus ultimately is able, successfully to distinguish the two. Following Steward's account in the Ontology of Mind, Marcus will insist that supplying a cause must itself provide a "certain kind of understanding" (161), but Dara's reason, one may reply, only provides assured understanding if we have the kind of knowledge which rules out non-rational causes like an excessive fondness for sweets.

Let us pursue this point by modifying an earlier example of Marcus's (29). Billy believes that pork is unhealthy because his sister has whispered this in his ear while he sleeps. Here Marcus will say that the truth of this reason's explanation does not depend on the subject's ability to express it, but this is because such a cause does not "rationally explain" this belief. Suppose, however, that, when queried, Billy confabulates, assuring us that he believes this because "I read it in Men's Health magazine." In this case, neither reason rationally explains Billy's belief, for it has no rational explanation. All the same, Billy may regard the unhealthiness of pork as "to be believed" on account of the credibility of its apparent source.

Marcus may respond -- as he does in the case of an objection that merely representing x as 'to be done' is distinguishable from doing x (87) -- that just because sometimes non-rational factors may intrude, this does not mean that in more favorable cases mere representation is not sufficient, that some other additional factor must always be posited. But even if we grant -- what, for some, would be heresy -- that mere rational representation has a special kind of causal efficacy -- the epistemic question of whether one can know, in any given case, that such causation obtains remains particularly troublesome, especially given rational causation's already cited rootedness in Anscombe.

One last point in this connection: Marcus does allow (20-21) that rational causation is compatible with recognizing that the originating cause of one's belief is some other factor, presently acknowledged as not a good reason at all (as if Descartes acknowledged that he started believing in God based on bedtime stories). To that extent, rational and efficient causation are not rivals. But I do not think he wants to allow, or that he should allow -- not without seriously weakening this whole notion (and accentuating my worries over whether it is stronger than mere "justification") -- that rational causation and the sustaining influence of non-rational ("efficient") mental causation can happily co-exist, each operative on its own level. Perhaps, they can combine (as partial causes), although it is unclear how one offers an account of such combination, but I would be disappointed to learn that the rational causation does not even tend to rule out (seemingly) rival, non-rational explanations.

We briefly return now to the outer aspect of rational causation: to the status of reasons as typically other than internal states of the agent. This view is controversial because, as Marcus must admit (cf. 108), a given worldly state of affairs affects one, qua reason, only insofar as it is internally represented in belief or some kindred mental state. So -- one may ask -- isn't reference to worldly states, then, just a kind of shorthand, as when one speaks of the heat as going on "because it got colder outside" (as opposed to: because the thermostat registered a drop in temperature)? Marcus does point out that in successful cases, an "equivalence" obtains between the worldly and the internal state explanation: we appeal, then, in successful cases, he says, to the same "underlying practical ability" (111). But, again, all of this would be true in the case of the heating mechanism and the successful exercise of its abilities. Where rational causation must markedly differ from this mechanism will concern, for Marcus, the mind's powers of understanding (134f) and self-expression, but these obviously concern its inner -- and not worldly -- states.

In the final chapter, Marcus mounts a number of challenges to standard physicalist positions. As one would expect, these challenges concern the difference between rational causation and the mere efficient causation characteristic of (mere) physical events". The fine structure of his discussion, however, requires that we bring in two earlier arguments.

First, Marcus will maintain that mental and physical states cannot be token-identical because while there are event-particulars, there is no such thing as state-particulars (227). This draws on an extremely interesting argument of the previous chapter in which, just to strike its main theme, the countability of event-sortals (e.g., crossings of Columbus Avenue) is played off against the absence of countable state-sortals. Apparent counterexamples -- like "How many times has your hair been blond?" -- he rejects on the ground that they require recourse to events (201) -- (hair dyeings). I would add, however, that a more troublesome state-type for him would be ones like "the holding of the French line" -- which are not only countable, but exhibit the end-directedness he sees as distinctive of events. While 'X was believing' entails 'X believed' in a way that 'Y was crossing Grand Avenue' does not entail 'Y crossed Grand Avenue' (198), that the French line was holding at noon does not entail that it held.

Second, along the same (relative identity) lines, Marcus maintains that events are individuated according to a relevant specification of a completed state: as crossings, tennis matches, and so forth. On this basis, he will claim that when this has a rational cause, 'crossing Columbus Avenue' does not "overlap with any physical event sortal because they are manifestations of different types of causation" (246).

Let us, for exploratory purposes, grant this last position, and suppose that I have crossed Columbus Avenue (as an instance of rational causation). Now, on Marcus's view (68f), briefly alluded to above, actions are, as such, mental events: to represent my moving my hand as 'to be done' in a suitably engaged (82) frame of mind is to initiate the change in question. But even if we accept that position, an already familiar concern remains: how will rational and efficient causation interact, as they must (if my body is actually to get across)? More troublingly, physical crossings of Columbus Avenue may be individuated according to their obvious, physical end-states, but acts of crossing that same avenue, as mental acts (representings) ill-fit this scheme for individuating events. Mental acts -- as opposed to extended mental actions like figuring out '12 x 35' in one's head -- are presumably to be individuated according to their type (belief, desire, etc.) and propositional object, and are not temporally extended processes unfolding to some distinctive terminating point (again, as with a tennis match). My question, then, is not whether one's act of crossing Columbus Avenue is identical with any mere physical event, but whether Marcus is entitled to qualify it as an event at all.

More generally, let us just say that, like other 'analytical' (as opposed to Cartesian) anti-physicalists (Jennifer Hornsby and Helen Steward are the two he regularly cites as helping to shape his own views), Marcus is faced with the challenge of locating "the mental" in a universe which is fundamentally physical, inasmuch as the mental is conceded to be supervenient on the physical (253). For Marcus, ultimately we have a dualism of event kinds (not, of course, substances). But the danger I see lurking here is that because this dualism of events is grounded in one of causality, his position, when pressed, seems likely to lead back to a more fundamental dualism of "ways of understanding" -- which threatens to take us back beyond even those little red books, to 'Verstehen vs. Erklären', and even to Kant!

Much work, then, as I see it, remains to be done before "rational causation" wins its lasting place in the philosopher's sun. In the meantime, I hope and expect that Rational Causation (the book) will exert a considerable influence, especially on discussions of the causation of action and of the metaphysics of states and events.