Rational Choice and Democratic Deliberation: A Theory of Discourse Failure

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Guido Pincione and Fernando R. Tesón, Rational Choice and Democratic Deliberation: A Theory of Discourse Failure, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 258pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521862691.

Reviewed by Gerry Mackie, University of California, San Diego


Rational Choice and Democratic Deliberation criticizes deliberative democratic theory, and even democracy simply as majoritarianism limited by basic rights, from a free-market standpoint.  It sometimes touches on what are conventionally called theories of distributive justice as well, and proposes self-sorted consensual and voluntary communities as a morally superior alternative to the range of actually existing liberal democracies.  It is written in the philosophical idiom, is careful in language and argument, anticipates objections and attempts to reply to them, and cites to a wide variety of literatures.

The deliberative tide runs high in democratic theory.  Both discussion and voting are essential elements of political democracy.  For most of the postwar period American political science neglected discussion, because voting is much easier to quantify and to formalize.  That formalization, however, terminated in a mistaken nihilism asserting that voting is necessarily arbitrary and meaningless.  At the same time European social theory, by way of Habermas and his theory of communicative action, offered an appealing alternative to homo economicus and a way to more rigorously theorize discussion.  The resultant deliberative democracy sought justifications of democracy in ideal and realized fora of public deliberation, and to a lesser extent sought to understand empirically the workings of actual political discussion.

Public deliberation is supposed, among other good things, to improve the epistemic and moral quality of authoritative public decisions.  Pincione and Tesón argue that such improvements are permanently infeasible in any majoritarian democracy.  Unfortunately, the institutional recommendations of deliberative democracy often do not go far beyond the injunction to increase group discussion, in its sites, in its duration, and in the number of persons and issues involved.  Actual deliberation, let's say, is an institution of group discussion generally expected to yield benefits, in terms of all relevant values, more worthy than the costs.  Who could be against that?  Increasing discussion, however, is not the same as increasing deliberation:  group discussion, if positive in effect, can still cost more than it's worth, and even can have quite undesirable effects.  The authors' theory of discourse failure exploits this vulnerability in many theories of deliberative democracy.

They avowedly conduct their argument largely within the confines of rational choice theory, and I respond in kind.  Their central theory of discourse failure runs as follows.  First, the public is rationally ignorant about political decisions.  Why?  No individual voter is decisive in bringing about an election outcome (or any other collective outcome) except in the extremely rare circumstances of breaking a tie.  Since citizens almost never have a decisive effect on the outcome, they are not instrumentally motivated to vote, a standard argument runs.  Even if they are somehow motivated to vote, each, lacking decisiveness, has no motive to engage in more costly information-gathering or in even more costly public deliberation.  Second, a majoritarian democracy with redistributive powers provides an incentive to politicians and lobbyists to capture coercive authority for their private ends.  Third, these politicians and lobbyists, knowing of citizens' rational ignorance, propagate false and self-serving facts, values, and theories in order to achieve public decisions favorable to their private ends.  Under such circumstances discourse generally fails, and such failure is irremediable in any majoritarian polity.  Finally, the authors offer as evidence for their theory of discourse failure the suggestion that surveys of public opinion show that voters often do not agree with the conclusions of the best social science, particularly free-market economics.

I argue elsewhere that the so-called paradox of nonvoting and its cognate rational ignorance are misconceived.  We know from empirical work that most voters are more motivated by the public interest than by private interest, and thus that they believe that their vote can contribute to the achievement of a great public good.  If voters are motivated only by whether an issue, candidate, or party wins in this election, their contribution to a victory does not vanish should the outcome be overdetermined (the decisiveness argument strangely asserts that adding one vote more than needed for a bare majority zeroes out the causal force of each vote in the enlarged majority).  If, as is more likely, many voters are also motivated by how few or by how many votes are obtained for their cause, in this election and in the future, then each vote is decisive towards advancing what the voter believes to be a great good.  Thus, it is not necessarily irrational to vote in a mass election, and it is not necessarily irrational to become informed and to deliberate over avoiding the calamities of bad government.

Schumpeter theorized, and public opinion research affirmed over and over again, that the huge majority of citizens know almost none of the basic facts and theories concerning politics and public policy.  Public choice theory elaborated on Schumpeter's explanation of apparent voter ignorance:  the individual has no incentive to be informed about public decisions in a democracy, but is fully incented to be informed about private decisions in the marketplace.  Rational choice theory, originating in assumptions concerning firms in perfect competition, standardly assumes that each agent is perfectly informed.  Voters, in their allegedly nondecisive environment, are an exception, but consumers, decisive over their own choices, are as if perfectly informed.  There is a big problem here though.  There are thousands of private decisions for an individual to make, limited attention, and only 24 hours in a day.  Information is not free and perfect, but is costly to obtain; plainly, the individual economizes on it.  People use a variety of cognitive shortcuts, often brutally swift heuristics, to make their decisions, even many of the larger ones.  The cheaper shortcuts are not as accurate as full-information processing, but they are believed to be worth it.  If we look further we learn from survey research that respondents' apparent ignorance extends well beyond fumbling trivial pursuit questions about politics, into other discursive knowledge such as basic history or biology, or the content of one's professed religion, and also into their many consumer decisions.  From behavioral research we learn that humans are susceptible to imperfect heuristics and misleading biases in all their practical activities.  That citizens are ill-informed but consumers are well-informed is theory, not fact.

The costliness of information, and susceptibility to heuristics and biases, in private choice has inspired some authors (Frey and Stutzer, Robert H. Frank, Sunstein and Thaler) to propose that government and other institutions help to overcome these obstacles to one's all-things-considered goals, almost a reversal of Pincione and Tesón's theory.

Citizen competence is a lively topic in political studies.  Madison proposed that representation is essential in order to refine and enlarge a public view that would otherwise be poorly informed and partial, and is superior to what we could call direct democracy.  Indeed, several contemporary democratic theorists -- Nadia Urbinati, Bernard Manin, Brennan and Hamlin in the public choice tradition -- defend representative democracy as a first-best institution, not a second-best approximation of direct democracy for polities of large number.  The democratic process is highly imperfect, and we would like to do better if we knew how.  Decision is delegated by the citizenry to specialized representatives, who in turn delegate to committees, cabinets, bureaucracies; and accountability runs in the other direction.  Competitive elections to fixed but repeatable terms motivate officials to provide the public good.  Parties organize and simplify political choices, and are motivated to criticize one another's arguments, conduct, and policies.  Deliberation raises questions in the broader public sphere, what we call the world of public opinion, and deliberation provisionally settles questions in the narrower public sphere of legislative determination.  Citizens lack omniscience, but are able to judge whether incumbents are making the polity better off or worse off.  You don't need to be a chef to judge the meal, nor to choose among competing restaurants.  This account of representation as an institution for economizing on costly information acquisition and public deliberation may be defective, but it is a plausible alternative to their claim of discourse failure and requires a response.  The essentially representative nature of modern political democracy goes untheorized, and unmentioned, however, by the authors of Rational Choice and Democratic Deliberation.

The dashed full-information expectation of early public opinion research, and the full-information assumption of rational choice theories of participation, are each subject to sophisticated challenges and revisions.  An introduction to these debates can be found in a special issue of Critical Review (18(1-3), 2007) on public competence.  Much of democratic theory has never assumed fully-informed citizens.  Survey results are an imperfect and often misleading approximation of public opinion, conceptually and empirically.  The low-information rationality school of Popkin, Lupia, and McCubbins emphasizes the information-economizing features of typical democratic institutions.  Laboratory experiments have shown that swift heuristics, such as finding out what interests are for and against a complex issue, adequately approximate full-information choice.  All of these claims are contested, of course.

The theory of discourse failure is frankly speculative, and so are, to a lesser extent, the theories of discourse success it seeks to correct.  The authors attempt though to suggest empirical vindication for their theory, and in this I believe they fail.  Their criterion of provisional policy correctness is the findings of the best social science.  This soon slips into the findings of the discipline of economics, and that soon slips into the libertarian prescription on every policy question, from which the authors never deviate an iota.  They casually dip into public opinion survey findings, and read them uncharitably, when they do not just baldly assert; they observe that the public disagrees with the libertarian policy prescription; and conclude that discourse failure is thus indicated.  Economic models show that trade liberalization is beneficial; citizens disagree; thus public deliberation is corrupt.  I accept that international trade is generally beneficial in the long run, but the argument depends on a crude utilitarianism which does not take seriously the separateness of persons.  That the winners win more than the losers lose is not succor to the losers.  A 50-year old factory worker in Ohio or North Carolina (each of which just elected a protectionist Senator) who loses his job, loses his health care coverage, has his pension looted, sees his neighborhood descend into poverty, and has his children move away, gains no satisfaction from knowing that the richest have doubled their incomes or that his grandchildren are likely to be better off.  The theorists say the winners could compensate the losers, but many of the same theorists would say that is something we should never do.  The authors selectively cite a few polls (and uncharitably misread a Pew poll, wrongly alleging irrationality (p. 12)) that show negative attitudes towards free trade, but because of variations in wording, contingencies, and contexts one should carefully examine and coherently interpret a range of polls.  Given that the U.S. is a representative democracy, it is interesting that opinion leaders more strongly support free trade than does the mass public, but popular support increases to the elite level when free trade is conditioned on government programs to assist those who lose their jobs.  Contrary to the authors, in several polls majorities approve of globalization as mostly good for Americans, for their standard of living, for consumers.  But support is contingent on whether compensation to losing workers is adequate.  Americans are strongly opposed to the offshoring of their jobs, arguably inconsistent with the predictions of trade theory, but is it unreasonable for them to worry, given the life-shattering adjustment costs many would suffer from mass offshoring and deep uncertainties about their social safety net (one poll reports that Americans fear loss of health care and other benefits more than loss of employment)?  A poll of 14 diverse countries finds more support than opposition for international trade as good for the economy, for consumers, for creating jobs, and even for job security.  This exercise could be repeated for many of the authors' references to public opinion.

The authors conclude with a vision of a consensual polity.  They conceive of a larger state with no "redistributive" powers, ruled not by a majoritarian legislature but by common-law courts.  It contains many substates, each self-selected and unanimously agreeing on its charter.  Consensus makes each participant decisive, thus each is motivated to become fully informed and to deliberate well, overcoming discourse failure.  Moreover, each citizen can choose the political institutions she favors, thus deliberativists can choose a deliberative substate, and thus overall there would be more quality deliberation than under majoritarian democracy.  This is an arrangement for Hobbes' mushrooms rather than flesh and blood human beings, however, for whom ties of family, friends, and place are often more important than disagreements about vegetarianism or the minimum wage.  Moreover, it assumes that agreement among individuals on one issue predicts agreement on another; to the extent that it does not, the number of substates needed for consensual sorting explodes.  And, decisiveness does not provide full information, it simply provides a limited incentive; information acquisition is still costly and must be economized.  The inevitable information asymmetry vitiates consensus.  Would parents motivated by decisiveness each obtain a lead-detection kit to ensure that their children are not poisoned by imported toys (as we have seen, concern for reputation was not sufficient for importers to monitor the problem themselves)?  Multiply the example by the 10,000 decisions of daily life:  full information is out of the question.  In conclusion, negotiation and information costs for fully consensual decisions are prohibitive.  That is why most theories of consensus are theories of hypothetical consensus.

The consensual polity can serve as a regulative ideal, the authors argue, justifying for example provisions to allow citizens in majoritarian democracies to opt out of coercive redistributive schemes or to liberalize immigration.  They neglect, however the economic theory of the second best, which says that if it is not feasible to satisfy the optimal value of one or more of some set of conditions required for attainment of some first-best ideal state, then attainment of the second-best state may require departure from the optimal value(s) of one or more of the remaining conditions.  The best way to approximate unanimity in a world of the status quo and transaction costs may be majority rule, for example.  The best actual approximation of their consensual polity would not necessarily mirror it.  Taking all costs into account I surmise that the best actual approximation would likely be our modern liberal democracy with discussion and voting.

Do not assume from this brief review that the authors overlook obvious objections to their theory.  They do not, although one might not be satisfied with their replies.  Even if their energetic arguments against majoritarian democracy fail to go through, they are due a response from democrats, whose theories might be strengthened by the exercise.