Aporetics: Rational Deliberation in the Face of Inconsistency

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Nicholas Rescher, Aporetics: Rational Deliberation in the Face of Inconsistency, University of Pittburgh Press, 2009, 161pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780822960577.

Reviewed by Bruce Hunter, University of Alberta


This is a welcome book from one of America's senior philosophers. It is clear, well written, interesting, and brief; indeed, perhaps too brief. Its topic is the rational resolution of inconsistencies among otherwise plausible theses, and so addresses a fundamental issue for epistemology, indeed for philosophy itself. An apory (plural: apories) is a group of individually plausible but collectively incompatible theses. Rescher provides a wealth of examples, albeit heavily schematized, throughout the book, which, besides an introduction and a summarizing conclusion, consists of one chapter on empirical inquiry and coherentism, three on counterfactuals, one on paradoxes, and two on apories in philosophy.

In his introduction, "The Nature of Apories", Rescher says that aporetic resolution calls for a comparative plausibility analysis that enables the chain of inconsistency to be broken at its weakest link by making the less plausible give way to the more plausible, restoring consistency (p. 3). The "generic and uniform" structure of inconsistency management means there is an overarching discipline of aporetics. Aporetics doesn't guarantee truth, but simply maximizes plausibility via considerations of systematic coherence. Its task "is not to engender new insights" (p.3) but to regiment and bring systematic order and coherence into those we already have. Doing nothing in the face of inconsistency isn't rational, and isn't tolerable, except as a last resort. Nonetheless, since there are always alternative resolutions of an apory, aporetics relies on "good judgement" rather than just logic to determine the weakest link and "right of way precedence".

However, in his conclusion, "The Rationale of Aporetic Variation", Rescher notes that how we rationally do so depends on the context and goals of an inquiry, and that criteria for the weakest link vary with the type of inquiry within which the apories arise. He schematizes versions of the weakest link principle depending on the nature of the inquiry and its commitment to security and evidentiation in abandoning theses as opposed to informativeness and explanatory power, or to a balance between them. The discussion here is certainly stimulating and insightful, even profound at times, but the schema is also insufficiently developed and related to the discussion in earlier chapters.

For example, in the conclusion, Rescher seems to contrast empirical inquiry with empirical philosophizing. In the former, inconsistencies arise in the light of new discoveries, and we prioritize security and find the weakest link in that which is most weakly evidentiated. In the latter, inconsistencies arise through data accumulation, and we seek overall credibility and find the weakest link in that which is least consonant with the fundamental commitments of one's overall position. However, in the second chapter, "Coherentism: An Aporetic Account to Empirical Inquiry", it's not clear there is any distinction between the two.

There, conflict in empirical inquiry arises through cognitive overcommitment to sources of information or rules of cognitive presumption like: in the absence of specific indications to the contrary, (1) trust the evidence of the senses and what you recall, (2) accept at face value what other people tell you, (3) trust the reliability of standardly-employed cognitive aids and instruments (telescopes, calculators, encyclopedias, etc.), and (4) accept the answers to questions the available evidence most strongly supports (through induction or pattern fitting) by being most smoothly consistent or consonant with the evidence. Presumptions can be generic (things change colour only through human intervention or only over considerable time) or specific (my car doesn't just change colour overnight). Presumptions can also concern sources of evidence for theses (e.g., perception, memory, testimony) or warranting principles (e.g., simplicity) one presumes to be reliable. When we face an apory like (a) my car is red (perception) (b) my car was yellow yesterday and it wasn't painted (memory) and (c) cars don't just change colour (uniformity), something has to give. Similarly for (1) the stick is bent (vision) and (2) it is straight (touch) -- cited in chapter 6, "Paradoxes" -- something has to give.

What are required in the search for coherence are plausibility ratings or comparative assessments of the relative acceptability of the "data" or plausible contentions, and a solution that minimizes implausibility and maximizes the retention of data and systematic interconnectedness. Background assumptions or commitments about the relative reliability of sources of information can play a key part. If one's background assumption or commitment is that visual perception is more reliable than memory with respect to colour, and touch more reliable than vision with respect to shape, and various specific beliefs reflect these assumptions, then respecting these assumptions is likely to maximize retention of data and systematic interconnectedness. "Systematic interconnectedness and plausibility go hand in hand", Rescher says (p. 21).

What about Rescher's claim that aporetics doesn't generate new insights, that aporetics is "reductive" not "ampliative" (p. 25) and proceeds "by way of diminution or compression"? This seems misleading. The solution to failed predictions from well-accepted theory and presumptions, e.g., the anomalies observed in the motion of Uranus in the eighteenth century, isn't just the rejection of a presumption, e.g., seven planets (observation), but the introduction of a novel and specific hypothesis, the existence of Neptune, that implies that rejection. In the case of logical and mathematical paradox, Rescher says in the concluding chapter that we reject the least inherently plausible for the sake of security. However, Russell, for example, thought we should feel free to introduce novel principles that aren't already evident so long as much that is already plausible can be deduced from them so that the resulting system of belief is thereby systematized. (See A. N. Whitehead and B. Russell, Principia Mathematica to *56, [Cambridge U. Press, 1973, p. 59], and also B. Russell, "On 'Insolubilia' and their Solution by Symbolic Logic" in Essays in Analysis, edited by Douglas Lackey [New York: Brazilier, 1973].)

To be fair, in chapter 8, "The Dialectics of Philosophical Development", Rescher emphasizes how apories in philosophy are resolved not just by rejecting theses but by drawing distinctions and qualifying and revising theses, and he provides a historical illustration of the development of Greek thought about matter and change. (Another example might be the resolution of Kantian antinomies and paralogisms -- cited in chapter 7, "Philosophical Aporetics" -- through the novel apparatus of the critical philosophy, and the distinction between noumena and phenomena and the limitations of our cognitive access to them.) This process "is not just a matter of clarification but also one of enhancing the acceptability (plausibility, tenability, truthfulness) of what has been retained" (p. 124). Drawing distinctions makes our concepts more sophisticated, indeed, introduces new concepts, makes theses and systems more elaborate, and increases understanding. But surely the same is true of empirical scientific inquiry, not just philosophy? In one place, Rescher compares philosophy and empirical science insofar as conceptual innovation in both "change[s] the subject" (127) to some extent. However, empirical inquiry innovates even without conceptual change, as the Neptune example shows, as well as more mundane examples of perceptual puzzles where the resolution of the apory involves adding comparative probability qualifications to our commitments to the reliability of vision, touch, or memory, and distinguishing circumstances and topics with respect to which they are reliable so as to explain away the rejected belief.

Nonetheless, even in the case of philosophy, Rescher still claims that "the problem of the philosopher is not one of inductive amplification but of systemic reduction" (p. 126). He does provide a schematic characterization of the dialectical development of philosophical positions, with detection of an inconsistency followed by deletion of a thesis followed by introduction of a distinction followed by reintroduction of a suitably qualified thesis. (p. 123) He might thus defend the reductive view by localizing apory resolution to the first two stages. However, that would seem artificial and wrong. After all, often we might not eliminate one of our theses unless we already have a way of explaining what went wrong, with the help of novel hypotheses or conceptual innovations, or choose to live with the inconsistency until we have developed them, just as scientists may live with anomalies in their theoretical perspectives and belief systems until they have the beginnings of a better, more fruitful theoretical alternative.

Rescher thinks that apories "pervade" (p. 102) philosophy, as he notes in chapter 7. Philosophers seek to resolve the key questions regarding our place in the world as a free rational agent, and fall into inconsistencies among a "family of plausible theses that is assertorically overdeterminative". These theses reflect cognitive commitments or fundamental commitments that are rooted in one's experience. They are a mix of common sense, personal experience, common knowledge, the science of the day, traditional lore, and the "teachings of history", and are "the foundation upon which sensible philosophizing must erect its theoretical structure." (p. 113)

Apories show how various positions and commitments are interlocked. One of many examples Rescher gives is the fact/value apory:

(1) all knowledge is based on observation (empiricism)

(2) we can only observe empirical facts (naturalism)

(3) knowledge of values is possible (value cognitivism), and

(4) we cannot infer values from empirical facts alone (axiology).

Resolving the conflict is to make a "philosophical commitment of some sort" (p. 107) that preserves "as much as one can of the overall informative substance of one's cognitive commitments" (p. 108). We must "weigh the comparative costs and benefits of a series of mutually exclusive alternatives" so that "philosophizing is a matter of cost-benefit relative to one's overall systematic commitments" (p. 118). At the same time, alternative philosophical positions resolving an apory "make different priorities" that are "by nature incompatible and irreconciliable". Presumably they reflect different commitments that in turn reflect different life experience. One wonders, however, whether this is really just a matter of "the sort of data that a philosopher's course of experience has brought his way" (p. 104), relative to which set of theses a resolution might be reasonable given some further commitment, rather than, at least some times, a matter of values, personal and cultural, even of personality, or attitudes to risk, etc.

In chapter 3, "Counterfactual Conditionals", Rescher argues that the understanding of counterfactuals is another area aporetics illuminates. Belief-contravening suppositions, according to which we suppose that one of our beliefs is false, create inconsistencies with other pre-existing beliefs, given the interlocking character of our beliefs, and require some deletion from that set. There are always alternatives to reject from our beliefs when we suppose something false to be true, or something true to be false, but aporetics tells us to reject the weakest link. In the case of counterfactual speculation, as opposed to empirical inquiry, the weakest link is what is contextually least fundamental, least general, or least informative, rather than what is least plausible or least evidentiated. If we suppose tigers to be canines, we reject our belief that they are feline, rather than our belief that felines aren't canines, and thus endorse the counterfactual "if tigers were canines, tigers wouldn't be felines" rather than "if tigers were canines, felines would be canines". And if New York City were in Georgia, then it wouldn't be in New York State, not that Georgia would overlap with New York State.

With respect to Quine's example of the nationality of Bizet and Verdi on the counterfactual supposition that they are countrymen, Rescher recognizes that Bizet's being Italian and Verdi's being French are equally general, but contextual clues and the wording of the question can tell us, he says, what to prioritize. If the question is what nationality Bizet is, given that he is a countryman of Verdi, as opposed to what nationality Verdi is, given that he is a countryman of Bizet's, we are being given priority instructions. And if we are simply supposing they are fellow countryman, we are given no instruction, and we can say only that if they were fellow countrymen, they would be either both Italian or both French.

Rescher's approach to counterfactuals is in the tradition of Chisholm and Goodman, but goes beyond them in explaining which other beliefs remain the same when we make belief-contravenening suppositions, and which change, and why. Thus in chapter 4, "Variant Analyses of Counterfactuals and Problems of Probability", he takes on Ramsey's holistic belief system account and Lewis' possible worlds account. He presents a number of putative counterexamples where their theories have counterintuitive results. But he also has more general complaints and diagnoses of their failings. The Lewis/Stalnaker appeal to what obtains in possible worlds where the counterfactual supposition obtains but that otherwise most closely approximates the actual world, whether descriptively or nomologically, requires a problematic overall similarity index, at least in the case of descriptive similarity. Moreover, it appeals in either case to an ontology of non-existent possible worlds that are unnecessary for the semantics of modal logic or the analysis of counterfactuals. Ramsey's requirement that we seek to maintain as much as possible (or make minimal changes to) our overall belief system when we add the counterfactual supposition requires a well defined concept of "minimal change" and "overall belief system".

Rescher claims his aporetic approach, by contrast, is all that is needed to understand why some counterfactual claims are appropriate and others not, and doesn't "involve the wider manifold of all relevant belief but only a look to a small handful of immediately salient items" (p. 53). Yet, in the case of the dialectics of philosophical development it seems to be the interrelatedness of apparently disparate issues, doctrines, and commitments that constantly yield new apories. Indeed, in chapter 5, "The Aporetics of Counterfactual History", Rescher notes that historical counterfactuals, e.g., "If Bush hadn't invaded Iraq, the Republicans would have won the Presidency in 2008" "must rest on an enthymematic basis of background belief" (p. 83). One may wonder how well defined the boundaries are between the handful of the immediately salient and the rest of one's beliefs in historical analysis and argumentation, but, still, Rescher may insist it isn't our entire belief system that is involved.

In sum, this is a highly readable book that provokes thought on a wide range of philosophical topics, especially the character of philosophical inquiry. One wishes the conclusion, and the schematism of aporetic inquiry it lays out, had been more developed, but one welcomes nonetheless Professor Rescher's reflections on all these topics.