Rational Deliberation: Selected Writings

Rational Deliberation

David Gauthier, Rational Deliberation: Selected Writings, Susan Dimock, Claire Finkelstein, and Christopher Morris (eds.), Oxford University Press, 2022, 338pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780192842992.

Reviewed by Paul Hurley, Claremont McKenna College, The Claremont Colleges


Most philosophy books, even most collections of essays, capture a philosopher’s view at some stage of her intellectual development. Rarely is a volume designed to capture the development through time of the central views of a major philosopher. This volume is one such rarity, and engagement with it leaves the reader with an appreciation both of just how difficult it is to implement such a design well, as David Gauthier and his editors do here, and of why such a task is nonetheless well worth undertaking.

Gauthier is one of the leading philosophers working on topics in ethics and practical reasoning over the past half century. He is best known as a distinctively ardent and able defender of rational choice theory, in particular of a maximizing theory of rational deliberation, and of a broadly Hobbesian approach to morality. This maximizing theory in its various forms is the default theory of rational choice in economics and political science. Gauthier, more so than perhaps any other philosopher, clarifies the core commitments of such a theory. Moreover, more so than any other philosopher, he teases out the important and surprising implications of such a theory for normative ethics, in particular, a commitment to a Hobbesian rather than (as is often thought) a consequentialist approach to morality. Again, more so than perhaps any other philosopher, he has defended such a theory against all comers, modifying it in ways that maintain its maximizing core while modifying it to deflect standard objections.

Part I of this volume contains many key essays in which Gauthier continues this maximizing project, all but one published after his Morals by Agreement (1986). But the volume also contains a series of essays (Part II) in which he provides grounds for growing disenchantment with central elements of the maximizing theory, and with the accounts of reasons and rational deliberation that it dictates. The essays in Parts IV and V reject this pervasive maximizing theory in favor of an optimizing alternative, and develop important implications of—and resources available to—this optimizing alternative. There is no more powerful critic than the convert, and there is no more effective case for conversion than one that traces the path of progressively greater disenchantment with the original view to its seemingly inevitable repudiation in favor of an alternative. His optimizing alternative is striking both for its radical break from his earlier positions and for its myriad points of continuity with those positions.

I will focus, in what follows, on these less widely known but more recent and, in my view, more significant essays in Parts IV and V. The essays in Part IV, coupled with his introduction, provide his case for rejecting maximizing in favor of optimizing, and make the case that maximizers are driven by their own commitments to become optimizers. In Part V, he augments this case by demonstrating the richer and more satisfying treatments of reasons, social practices, morality, and legitimate political authority that such a move to optimization facilitates. Even those, myself included, who hold that the path to a defensible account of rational deliberation leads beyond optimizing outcomes have much to learn from Gauthier’s arguments unmooring standard grounds for the commitment to maximizing. Moreover, the robust resources of an optimizing account, compared with its maximizing cousin, raise the prospect of a heretofore nonexistent overlapping consensus between a defensible theory of rational choice and more traditional Kantian, Humean, and Aristotelian approaches on many central issues concerning reason, ethics, and the acceptable exercise of political authority.

The essays in Parts IV and V contain some of the most exciting recent work that I have encountered recently on ethics, metaethics, and theories of reason and rational deliberation. Gauthier’s account of instrumental reasoning (ch. 14) challenges the terms of the current debate in powerful ways, evoking thoughts of Anscombe more than Hume. His general account of reasons weaves together themes from Scanlon, Kant, Hobbes, Hampton, Gibbard, and Hume in new and exciting ways (chs. 11,14,15). His account of naturalized categorical requirements is a tantalizing sketch of a potential reconciliation of central Hobbesian and Kantian commitments (14). His grounds for rejecting maximizing in favor of optimizing as the core of rational deliberation free the relationship between reason and value from the stultifying yoke of maximization (chs. 11 and 12), laying the foundation for many of the advances just listed. For those unfamiliar with Gauthier’s work elaborating and defending the maximizing theory, Parts I and II provide a wonderful crash course (with an accompanying deep dive into his account of intention in Part III). But anyone working in ethics, metaethics, rational choice theory, and/or on reason and rational deliberation will find that engagement with Gauthier’s more recent arguments more than repays the effort.

From Maximizing to Optimizing

To capture the change in Gauthier’s position, it is perhaps most useful to return to our old friend, the Prisoner’s Dilemma. On the traditional maximizing theory of rational choice, the rational choice when confronted with the dilemma is to confess. This is the dominant choice and the choice that maximizes utility, and the outcome of the choice is in equilibrium. But notoriously, the outcome is not pareto-optimal. It is not confessing, if the other prisoner does not confess as well, that results in much less jail time for each than if each pursues a maximizing strategy and confesses. Because such coordination scenarios are pervasive in social interactions, and the outcome of rational choice understood as maximizing choice fails to be optimal in all such cases, rationality thus understood invites “unwarranted counsel of despair” (241). The role of social institutions and social practices, on such a view, is to mitigate the grounds for despair—to alter “the net payoffs of our interactions, or the way in which we relate our preferences to our actions” (241) to more closely approach pareto-optimality. Several of the essays in Part I of this volume defend a sophisticated and nuanced version of this orthodox maximizing theory of rational choice.

But in the more recent essays contained in Part IV, most notably “Twenty-Five On” and “Achieving Pareto-Optimality” (chs. 11 and 12), Gauthier argues that this “orthodox theory is […] mistaken [….] It should be superseded by a theory based on Pareto-optimality and cooperation” (244). It is the pareto-optimal choice in the Prisoner’s Dilemma—not confessing—that is rational. More generally, the correct, pareto-optimizing theory of rational interaction “prescribes a strategy for each person that, taken together yield an outcome P-superior to the outcome of the prescribed best-reply strategies” (244). His core project in the Part IV essays is to hold on to the deep insight of the orthodox theory, that “rational agents seek to bring about what they most value” (243), while freeing rational deliberation from the misguided “dogma that individual actions are rational only if maximizing” (243). It is simply not plausible, as the orthodox maximizer maintains, that “an interaction may be fully rational, yet its outcome may leave on the table benefits that could have been enjoyed by some persons at no cost to others” (242). It is optimization, not maximization, that is the core of the correct account of rational choice, because even for those considering only their own benefit, “both persons would do better not to seek their best (maximizing) response to the other, but be guided by optimality to their mutual benefit” (xv). The aim of deliberation, after all, “is to determine the action that would best realize the aims of agents given their preferences” (xv), and such an aim, properly understood, dictates optimizing, not maximizing, and dictates an understanding of defensible social institutions and social practices through appeal to this optimizing aim.

The second halves of many of the essays in Part IV, and the later essays in Part V, flesh out and provide further support for Gauthier’s particular optimizing account of rational deliberation and choice. The standard maximizing approach, he argues, dictates both a narrow internalist account of the relationship between reasons and motivation, and a single source for all reasons. Optimization, he argues, frees us from these implausible constraints, and in the process, fosters superior accounts of reasons and their many sources, of moral reasons in particular, and of justification for legitimate political authority properly understood. Perhaps the best essay for understanding this richer, more satisfying account of reasons is the last in this volume, “Friends, Reasons, and Morals.” The most important essay for unpacking the broader implications of this new account of rational deliberation, including its support for a “naturalized Kantian” approach and for an account of legitimate political authority that yields strong criticisms of the status quo, is to be found in the penultimate essay, “Reason’s End.” I will briefly discuss the central arguments in each. 

Even as late as 1996, in “Individual Reason” (ch. 13), Gauthier offers an account of rational reflection upon which it “destroys the bonds that hold traditional forms of human society together,” even as it “provides the basis for reconstructing these bonds,” an approach reminiscent of Nietzsche’s suggestion in The Genealogy of Morals that the existing altar must first be broken before a superior one might be erected. But Gauthier’s later essays included here, most notably “Friends, Reasons, and Morals,” evoke Neurath’s boat more than Nietzsche’s altar. Here many of our reasons are claimed to be “tied to social practices in the sense that a participant [. . .] must [. . .] take certain considerations, determined by the practice, to be reasons, and employ them deliberately as reasons” (300). There are multiple sources of reasons that can provide standards “for evaluating [. . .] reason-giving practices,” but we must appeal to one or more of these sources of reason-giving considerations in evaluating any other, and none of the reasons from any source is itself immune from evaluation.

Central to Gauthier’s argument here is an illuminating comparison and contrast between friendship and morality as reason-giving practices. Friendship, he suggests, is a social practice that establishes normative expectations. A person is a true friend only if she takes certain considerations to provide her with reasons to act (297), and is “motivated to act on the basis of these considerations” (297). A person motivated only by his own benefit, not by reasons of friendship, cannot be a true friend. Similarly, a person is moral, a true cooperator, only if he takes certain considerations, e.g., that he has made a promise, to provide him with reasons to act (313), and is motivated to act on the basis of these considerations. Morality, like friendship, is a social practice, and the person motivated only by her own benefit rather than by reasons of morality is not truly acting morally.

Optimizing comes into Gauthier’s account of reasons here because individual benefit is itself a source of reasons that can provide a standard for evaluating these reason-giving practices. But benefit is only one among other sources of reasons; moreover, the benefit of a life of friendship is only available to agents who are motivated in the relevant situations by reasons of friendship, not by reasons of benefit. Likewise, Gauthier argues, the benefit of a life of morality is only available to agents who are motivated in the relevant situations by reasons of morality, not by reasons of benefit (313). Neither the claims of morality nor those of friendship are “established and weighed by their direct bearing on preferences or benefit” (308). Considerations of benefit, and of mutual benefit, can of course reinforce moral reasons and reasons of friendship, but so too can the appropriate weight of reasons of benefit be evaluated through appeal to considerations of friendship and/or morality (305).

The metaethical implications of this more nuanced account of the interplay among reasons, individual benefit, and social practices is on full display in “Reason’s End” (ch. 14), Gauthier’s articulation and defense of a position he characterizes as Kantian naturalism. He takes the view to be Kantian because it provides an account of reasons and deliberation that includes not just hypothetical imperatives, but simulacra of Kant’s assertoric and categorical imperatives as well (274). Gauthier’s central partners and foils here are Jean Hampton and Alan Gibbard. He first articulates an account of the “normative authority and motivational efficacy of our instrumental reasoning without going beyond the limits of Gibbardian naturalism” (283). He then argues for a similarly naturalized account both of assertoric imperatives, imperatives that provide subjectively necessary grounds for the agent’s ends as “entering into a life she finds fulfilling,” and of categorical imperatives, now understood as appealing not to conditions of rational agency simpliciter, but to such conditions “within a certain form of society” (287). Morality “requires interaction” (287), and certain “imperatives of agreement” with “categorical force” track “the terms of agreement on conditions of voluntary interaction among rational persons” (288). Metaphysical naturalism comes together in one and the same view with an account of the normative and motivating force of rationality and morality that has a distinctively Kantian structure.

Gauthier takes his Kantian naturalism to establish that there are “objectively necessary” imperatives of agreement, imperatives determined by “the idea of voluntary ex ante agreement” (288). These terms determine the “framework within which each may constrain her conception of the good and plan for a fulfilling life” (288). What are these terms? Gauthier maintains that the only acceptable concept of society for articulating these terms is captured in Rawls’ formula of society as a cooperative venture for mutual advantage (287), but he puts his own quite distinctive spin on this concept. Mutual advantage requires that each person refrain from taking advantage of each other person in their interactions—from “bettering oneself” by “worsening another” (312). But the cooperative interaction that is required of rational optimizers also must be seen as “fairly” (313) securing such advantage. Gauthier invokes a principle from his earlier work, “maximin proportional gain,” (e.g., 226) to specify the nature of such fairness, but argues more generally that any viable alternative conception of mutual advantage must secure an outcome that is “both relatively efficient, so that it approaches Pareto-optimality, and relatively fair” (227). Such mutual advantage, he argues, requires a range of available social roles for each person compatible with a set of life plans, coupled with “that share of the joint social product which rewards effective occupancy” (287). Moreover, Gauthier emphasizes at several points the reformist implications of such a principle. In most societies, he argues, “an elite group of males organize society so that they take the lion’s share of the benefits it provides, resulting in a society that meets neither the standard of efficiency nor that of fairness” (228). Although many elements of this account are familiar from Gauthier’s earlier constrained maximization approach, the move to rational deliberation as at its core optimizing, the resultant plurality of sources of reasons, and his intriguing Kantian naturalist metaethics produce an account of rationality and rational deliberation that transposes all of these elements into a different—and richer—key.

Gauthier is quite clear at several points in these more recent essays that he is offering sketches of positions in need of further defense and development. One topic that invites development is his account of action/interaction. Although Gauthier rejects outcome-centered ethics (consequentialism), his account of the actions that it is rational to choose is often framed in outcome-centered ways—actions bring about outcomes, and reasons to act are presumably reasons to promote such outcomes. (e.g., 268) Such an outcome-centered account of actions is dictated by an account of reasons as grounded in individual benefit—in maximizing the satisfaction of the agent’s preferences. But in his later essays Gauthier rejects the appeal to benefit as the sole, or even ultimate, source of reasons. His focus shifts from beneficial action alone to interactions, and in particular, to friendly, respectful, fair interactions. Such interactions for such reasons reflecting such values would not appear to aim at bringing about outcomes, but instead at the completion of the performances of the relevant actions guided by the reasons agents have for undertaking them and the values such reasons reflect. Our aim in such cases would seem to be interacting well as part of a life lived well. Although Gauthier is quite aware of his cautious rapprochement with Kant in this later work, these considerations suggest in addition a rapprochement with Aristotle, in particular with Aristotle’s rejection of accounts of action/interaction as a species of production. It is in this context particularly striking that Gauthier’s most expansive characterization of deliberative procedures, upon which they “should be judged [. . .] by their overall ability to direct the agent so that matters go as well as possible” (310), could just as readily characterize Anscombe’s account as his own.

Dewey, Kant, and many other important figures in philosophy saved much of their best, most subtle and nuanced, and most powerful work for last. Rational Deliberation demonstrates that Gauthier’s name should be added to this list.


Gauthier, David. Morals By Agreement. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1986.