Rational Sentimentalism

Rational Sentimentalism

Justin D’Arms and Daniel Jacobson, Rational Sentimentalism, Oxford University Press, 2023, 230pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199256402.


Reviewed by Jonas Olson, Stockholm University


Rational Sentimentalism is the product of a long-standing and productive collaboration between Justin D’Arms and Daniel Jacobson. The book is divided into three parts and nine chapters that span large territories in the philosophy of emotion and value, and related areas. In lieu of a chapter-by-chapter overview, here is an attempt at a brief summary of some of the book’s main messages: In thinking about values and reasons, philosophers have traditionally assumed a kind of hegemony of the moral, neglecting other kinds of values, such as the funny, the disgusting, and the fearsome. These are to be explained in terms of sentiments, i.e., dispositions to emotional responses, such as amusement, disgust, and fear. That is why the theory defended is a kind of sentimentalism. Philosophers’ myopic focus on the moral makes for a kind of estrangement from the world of ordinary people, in which the funny, the disgusting, the fearsome, and suchlike values, matter at least as much as the right and the good, and the wrong and the bad.

To be funny, disgusting, or fearsome, is not to elicit amusement, disgust, or fear; it is for these emotional responses to be correct, merited, or fitting. This is why the theory is called ‘rational sentimentalism’. Emotions can be simultaneously fitting and morally objectionable, which is to say, for example, that there might be reasons (of fit) to be amused by a racist or sexist joke, while there are moral reasons not to be. We should thus recognise a plurality of values and reasons for actions and attitudes, in which sentimental or ‘human’ values, and ‘anthropocentric’ reasons associated with them, may conflict with moral values and reasons. To think otherwise is to commit the ‘moralistic fallacy’.

For related reasons, virtue provides no standard of fittingness (163). Just as virtuous people may not be amused by funny but racist or sexist jokes, they will not fear all things fearsome, or envy all things enviable. Moreover, people can be admirable for having emotions that are not fitting. An example well-known to many readers is that of the unfortunate lorry driver, who, through no fault of his own, runs over and kills a young child. Although guilt is not a fitting emotional response in this situation, the lorry driver is to be admired for feeling guilty (173–74).

Another important conclusion that D’Arms and Jacobson draw from their pluralism of values and reasons is that prominent versions of sentimentalism about morality fail. At the heart of moral sentimentalism is the idea that moral concepts can be explained in terms of fitting or merited emotions. Against this, D’Arms and Jacobson argue that wrongness, for example, is not equivalent to guilt-worthiness: an agent can feel merited or fitting guilt for his action, although it was not morally wrong. The myth of Agamemnon is used as an illustrative case. Readers are invited to assume that Agamemnon acted as he morally ought to when he sacrificed his own daughter Iphigenia in order to secure success for his Greek fleet at Troy. Still, his betrayal of parental loyalty makes guilt a fitting emotional response (chapter 9). This leads D’Arms and Jacobson to suggest a ‘dual aspect theory of guilt, on which [guilt] appraises one’s own action as either a personal betrayal or a wrong, and hence can be fitting in either case’ (206, emphasis preserved). They conclude that this shows that ‘guilt is not a wholly moral emotion, because it is merited by morally permissible betrayals of personal relationships’ (206).

It is not clear that this objection refutes moral sentimentalism, however. Note first that the dual aspect theory of guilt seems to rest on a dubious duality between personal betrayal and moral wrongness. An alternative view, which seems no less plausible, is that any instance of personal betrayal is as such pro tanto morally wrong, although some may be morally permissible, or even obligatory, all things considered. Suppose next that guilt-worthiness, like moral wrongness, can be either pro tanto or all things considered. Moral sentimentalists can then maintain that Agamemnon’s action was morally wrong and hence guilt-worthy as far as betraying and killing Iphigenia go, but not morally wrong and hence not guilt-worthy as far as betraying and killing Iphigenia for the sake of securing the success of his fleet go.

The second part of the book focuses on theories of emotion. In it, D’Arms and Jacobson offer the following provisional list of what they call ‘natural emotions’: amusement, anger, contempt, disgust, envy, fear, guilt, jealousy, joy, pity, regret, shame, and sorrow (107). Each item on this list is a pan-cultural and not socially constructed ‘psychological kind, episodes of which are unified by their common motivational structure’ (106).

According to prominent cognitivist theories of emotion, evaluative judgements partly constitute emotions, and different kinds of emotions are distinguishable in terms of the different kinds of evaluative judgement that constitute them. Cognitivism does not sit well with rational sentimentalism, which aims to explain value and evaluative judgement in terms of emotions, rather than the other way around (90–91).

D'Arms and Jacobson make a forceful case against cognitivism, arguing, inter alia, that it ‘undermines the ambition to carve the emotions at their psychological joints’ (98), and prompts its adherents to invent ‘chimerical emotions’—such as agent-regret—that fail to pick out any particular kind of psychological state with a distinctive motivational profile (96–104). A related but more direct challenge to cognitivism, which the authors have pressed with compelling force in their previous collaborations, and which has been debated extensively, concerns the recalcitrance of emotions. This is the phenomenon that some emotions persist although they apparently conflict with the subject’s relevant evaluative beliefs or judgements. Fear of flying is a familiar example. Many people who suffer from excessive fear of flying are well aware that the probability of a plane crash is considerably smaller than, say, a car crash. But their beliefs about the probabilities do not quench or temper the emotion. It appears, then, that cognitivism must attribute conflicting beliefs or judgements to many subjects suffering from various forms of phobia (109–110).

D’Arms and Jacobson’s preferred alternative to cognitivism—which is logically independent of, but congenial to, rational sentimentalism about value—is the motivational theory of emotion. According to this theory, emotions are psychological phenomena that are to be understood in terms of ‘their distinctive motivational structure of goal and tendency’ (105). The goal of an emotion is what the emotion—or the subject undergoing it—aims to achieve; its action tendency are direct and urgent ways of pursuing its goal (111–12). Fear, for example, has threat avoidance as its general goal, and the action tendency of fear is the kind of behaviour that conduces to threat avoidance in the situation at hand, be it fleeing, freezing, or kicking and shouting.

While the motivational theory seems able to provide a promising account of fear and other emotions, D’Arms and Jacobson concede that ‘there are many states commonly considered emotions [that] do not involve any distinctive goal or action tendency’ (115, emphasis preserved). They mention love, hope, and awe as possible examples. It is notable that these putative emotions do not appear on the authors’ provisional list of natural emotions. It is also notable that what the authors express commitment to is the claim that ‘there are natural emotions to which the motivational theory applies’ (115), which should not be read as the claim that the motivational theory applies to all natural emotions. Indeed the authors concede that ‘it is hard to identify goals and action tendencies for joy and sorrow’ (123) appearing on their provisional list of natural emotions. The scope and ambition of D’Arms and Jacobson’s motivational theory of emotion are thus not entirely clear. The theory appears to apply only to a restricted class of natural emotions. The size of this class is difficult to determine, however.

There are also reasons to question some of what D’Arms and Jacobson say about emotions that the motivational theory allegedly does apply to. They argue at length that the generic goal of anger is retaliation. While it appears fairly uncontroversial that ‘in many paradigmatic cases . . . the goal of an angry agent is retaliation’ (112), it sounds perverse to suggest that parents who are angry with their children typically seek retaliation. Some of D’Arms and Jacobson’s remarks seem consistent with this—they conclude, for example, that the goal of anger is ‘primarily retributive’ (199, emphasis added). On the other hand, they also say that ‘if some genuine anger lacks any retributive goal . . . that would count as evidence against our view’, and that ‘either [an emotion type] isn’t anger, or it involves a retaliatory motive’ (197).

Perhaps what D’Arms and Jacobson would say about parents who are angry with their children that their goal of retaliation is suppressed or subconscious. While they do not discuss parent-child relations in particular, they do consider the more general case of anger within intimate relationships, and they question the reliability of subjects’ introspection about their motives in such cases (197). As they say, ‘Decent people may not be aware of [their retaliatory] motives or endorse them’, and they take this to support one of the key claims in the book, namely that ‘emotional goals are discontinuous with practical reason’ (197–98).

One upshot of this is that the motivational theory attributes to subjects motives or goals of which they are not aware and would perhaps reject or deny having. This raises the question of whether this is any less uncharitable, and ultimately less problematic, than cognitivism’s attribution of conflicting beliefs or judgements to subjects undergoing recalcitrant emotions. It is not difficult to predict that the authors will affirm that it is, but it would have been interesting to see this response developed in greater detail.

It would also have been interesting to know more about the metaphysics and epistemology of fittingness or merit. It is not difficult to agree with D’Arms and Jacobson that to find something shameful or disgusting is not merely to judge that it elicits shame, but to think that shame or disgust at it is fitting or merited (62). But is the intuitive thought that there are relations of fittingness, or merit, philosophically defensible? How can we come to know what merits shame or disgust? In parts 1 and 3 of the book, various kinds of scepticism are criticized, sometimes at length (as in the cases of ‘figment scepticism’ and ‘shadow scepticism’ in chapters 1 and 2); sometimes with a few disparaging remarks (denying the claim that some things ‘really are disgusting’, for example, is said to reveal ‘an impoverished imagination’ (7)). But the nature of fittingness, and how we can arrive at justified conclusions about what is fitting, remains obscure.

Here is what D’Arms and Jacobson say about anger, which is one of the emotions they take to be sometimes fitting:

[W]hat needs to be shown in order to defend fitting anger is that humans have a deep and wide concern for what people do and why they do it, which is ratified through their moral psychology, not just in dispositions to anger. A concern is deep when it would be either impossible or very costly to extirpate. It is wide to the extent that it is reflected in a variety of distinct and mutually supporting commitments and psychological tendencies. We claim that the conjunction of these two features can vindicate sentimental values as the source of anthropocentric reasons. (50, emphases preserved; see also 203)

It is unclear how precisely to understand this ‘vindication’ especially as regards the questions of whether and how it addresses metaphysical and epistemological queries about fittingness. There are also normative worries in the vicinity. Taking inspiration from D’Arms and Jacobson’s vocabulary, let us coin the term ‘anthropozealotry’ for the view that any human concern that is deep and wide thereby vindicates sentimental value and anthropocentric reasons, and makes the associated emotion fitting. (D’Arms and Jacobson call the view that some natural emotion is never fitting ‘zealotry’ about that emotion, and defenders of the view they call ‘zealots’.) Anthropozealotry seems normatively unacceptable; just think of xenophobia, the human tendency to feel fear of, or be hostile towards, strangers or people considered as outsiders to one’s group.

D'Arms and Jacobson seem not to be anthropozealots. They make clear that ‘Not everything that matters universally to human beings is a source of reasons, because some human tendencies are undermined by critical reflection’ (55). Xenophobia and racism might be two such examples. But then one wonders why the human tendency to feel anger and seek retaliation could not also be undermined by critical reflection, and why the ‘utilitarian theory of punishment’, which they claim to be belied by rational sentimentalism (192), cannot thereby be restored.

D'Arms and Jacobson are surely right to claim that it would be very difficult and perhaps impossible for us human beings to extirpate anger and the associated motivation to retaliate. But why draw their normative conclusions? Why not conclude instead that the ‘anthropocentric’ reasons and ‘human’ values that supposedly fitting emotions generate are not normative reasons and genuine values? Tragic as it may sound, human psychology may be largely alienated from normative and evaluative reality.

To conclude, this book covers several fascinating themes and its discussions are often engaging. At various places, greater clarification is called for, but the lasting impression is that it makes a refreshing and welcome contribution to value theory. While I remain unsure whether it is fitting to regret the philosophical profession’s negligence of the funny, the disgusting, the fearsome, and the like, there is no doubt that Rational Sentimentalism goes a long way to remedy it.


Thanks to Krister Bykvist for helpful comments on an earlier draft.