Rationalism, Platonism and God

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Michael Ayers (ed.), Rationalism, Platonism and God, Oxford University Press, 2008, 143pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780197264201.

Reviewed by Yitzhak Y. Melamed, Johns Hopkins University


"The safest general characterization of the European philosophical tradition is that it consists of a series of footnotes to Plato" (Alfred North Whitehead, Process and Reality, (Free Press, 1979 [1929]), 39). While Whitehead's memorable declaration may motivate the study of the role of Platonism in Western philosophy, it might just as well provide a strong reason for desperation concerning the possibility of such a study. "What is everywhere is nowhere (or at least not in any particular place)," one might suspect. Obviously, the alleged ubiquity of Platonism may still allow one to point out various degrees and aspects of the reception of Platonism, but it definitely makes the task quite challenging.

'Platonism' and 'rationalism,' two of the terms in the title of this book, are pretty ambiguous. In the context of modern philosophy, rationalism, as opposed to 'empiricism,' is used to denote a certain historical school which allowed for the possibility of knowledge that is not derived from the senses. In the past few years, a significantly different notion of rationalism has been suggested by Michael Della Rocca, according to whom rationalism amounts to an unrestricted acceptance of the Principle of Sufficient Reason and the rejection of any brute facts. This definition of rationalism may redraw traditional dichotomies in the historiography of modern philosophy.

Michael Ayers, a prominent scholar of early modern philosophy and the editor of the current volume, employs, and to an extent defends, the traditional rationalism/empiricism dichotomy: "The historiographical and critical employment of the rationalist-empiricist distinction has, no doubt, often been crude, but its denigration has often been based on flimsy and specious interpretative argument" (2). If I understand Ayers correctly, the main idea behind this collection was that perhaps the common distinction between rationalists and empiricists could be clarified and illuminated through their opposite attitudes toward a certain "broadly defined" (Christianized) Platonism.

The so-called 'rationalists' do have something in common, as do the 'empiricists'. The great seventeenth-century rationalists worked (if heretically, and each in his own way and for his own reasons) within a heavily theologized Platonic tradition. Each found room and work for a set, or significant subset, of characteristically Platonic or Neoplatonic concepts and models … . The 'empiricists', Bacon, Gassendi, Hobbes, Locke and others, ignored or rejected these Platonic notions and looked back to a different, more naturalistic, also ancient tradition -- above all Epicurus and Lucretius" (3).

Ayers also suggests the existence of a rather tight connection between early modern immaterialism and Platonism (4). Berkeley, according to Ayers, should be considered as a special case: one who "drew on both traditions" (4, n. 2). To my mind, there are quite a few more counterexamples to the suggested dichotomy. Both Ibn-Gabirol (the author of the Neoplatonic philosophical treatise, Fons vitae) and Giordano Bruno were self-professed Platonists for whom matter was nothing short of divine. More importantly, Spinoza, who clearly endorses the notion of knowledge as not based on the senses, explicitly considered himself a foe of Platonism, a foe whose philosophical heroes were none other than Epicurus and Lucretius (more on this shortly).

One may object against Ayers that an attempt to explain rationalism through Platonism is just an attempt to explain the somewhat unclear through the even less clear, but to my mind this is a project worth pursuing. The indeterminacy of the two notions makes this exploration a truly difficult task, yet whatever results the study of this hypothesis yields they should be illuminating. The study of the role of Platonic and Neoplatonic thought in early modern philosophy has come to occupy a central place in recent North American scholarship (much through the pioneering work of Christia Mercer, regrettably not mentioned in this collection). The current volume provides an important contribution to this expanding field.

Ayers, under the auspices of the British Academy, organized a symposium on the role of Platonism in early modern rationalist philosophy. In 2004, five other prominent scholars participated in it with him. The volume under review consists of the three papers and the three responses presented at that symposium.

John Cottingham's contribution, "Plato's Sun and Descartes's Stove: Contemplation and Control in Cartesian Philosophy," is a nuanced and careful attempt to point out major Platonic and anti-Platonic elements in three sub-fields of Descartes' philosophy: physics, first philosophy, and morals. Cottingham discusses some parallels between Descartes' cosmology and the Timaeus, yet argues that upon close examination Descartes' physics prefigures "the bleaker, ethically blank universe so typical of our modern scientific world picture" (20). According to Cottingham, Cartesian laws of nature do not exhibit any particular beauty, design, or purposiveness, and to that extent Cartesian cosmology is in sharp contrast with the "value-laden cosmos of the Timaeus" (24). This picture changes significantly once we turn to the second sub-field: "When we move to Cartesian first philosophy, by contrast, the Platonism is powerfully integrated into the very structure of [Descartes'] thinking" (27). Drawing on the Third Meditation, Cottingham points out important similarities between Descartes' contemplation of the idea of the infinite God and the metaphor of intellectual illumination in the Christianized Platonic tradition of Augustine and Bonaventure. This brings us to Cottingham's discussion of the moral dimension of Descartes' philosophy, where he claims that Descartes oscillates between the two opposite attitudes of active manipulation and quietist contemplation. While in his study of nature, Descartes follows the modern aim of enabling "us to understand and control all the objects in our environment as effectively as mechanics and artisans now manipulate their instruments" (33), Descartes adopts the alleged Christian-Platonic contemplative and quietist mode of awestruck adoration when directing his thought toward God.

In his response to Cottingham's essay, Douglas Hedley criticizes Cottingham's identification of contemplation with quietism, arguing that "the detached contemplation of truth does not imply an indifference toward the fruits of discovery" (50). Addressing Cartesian metaphysics, Hedley raises another important point, one stressed by other contributors as well (though, interestingly, not by Cottingham). According to Hedley, "the temporal priority of the Cogito can mask the logical priority of the certainty of divine existence articulated by the ontological argument" (48). Presumably, Hedley here has in mind Descartes' claim in the Third Meditation that "my perception of the infinite, that is, God, is in some way prior to my perception of the finite, that is, myself." To my mind, Hedley's judgment regarding "the logical priority" of the knowledge of God in Descartes is a bit too hasty. First, we should notice that Descartes qualifies the claim by saying that only "in some way [quodammodo]" the knowledge of God is prior to the knowledge of the I. This seems to imply that in some other way, the knowledge of God is not prior to the Cogito. Secondly, it is not clear to me what Hedley means here by the "temporal priority" of the Cogito. If it is a mere result of Descartes' writing style or exposition that the Second Meditation comes before the Third, then we should try to reconstruct, or correct, Descartes' argument and prove the existence of God relying only on what is granted at the end of the First Meditation. As long as we do not have such a successful (and historically loyal) reconstruction, we have, I believe, a genuine problem. In order to support his point and criticize the "widespread image of Descartes as the harbinger of modern 'subjectivity'," Hedley points out that "the theories of such Cartesians as Malebranche and Spinoza are distinctly theocentric, tending to submerge the human subject to God" (48). While I completely agree with Hedley regarding the theocentric qualities of Malebranche's and Spinoza's thought, I think that in the case of Spinoza, this is a line that is consciously pushed against Descartes. Just consider what happens to the Cartesian Cogito in Spinoza's Ethics: a short (and marginal) axiom -- "Homo cogitans" (E2a2),[1] and then, Move on! This is nothing short of an intentional insult at the great master.[2]

Hedley also suggests an important distinction between the explicit and self-conscious Platonism of Ficino, Cudworth, and More, and the unconscious Platonic elements found in Descartes and among his milieu (45). Since, as Cottingham points out, Descartes "hated to acknowledge predecessors," it seems that explicit Platonism is trivially ruled out in the case of Descartes. But, unlike Descartes, Spinoza spends much time in arguing with his predecessors. Michael Ayers' essay on Spinoza is clearly a work of a mature and careful historian of philosophy, and while I mostly agree with his conclusions and found the essay rich and insightful, I was somewhat surprised by his failure to consider Spinoza's explicit discussions of Plato and his followers. Had he done so, he would have found a Spinoza that is uniformly and highly critical of Plato and the Platonists, describing their views as "speculations" (TTP, Preface [G III/9]) and "fabrications" (TTP, Ch. 13 [G III/168]). Spinoza particularly denounces Platonic realism about universals in a language that seems to target the very Christianized/Augustinian Platonism that is the focus of the current collection ("They maintain … that these Ideas are in God's intellect, as many of Plato's followers have said, viz., that the universal ideas have been created by God" (Short Treatise, I, iv [G I/42])). But Spinoza's most telling discussion of Platonism is in the rather bizarre letter to Hugo Boxel, a staunch believer in ghosts who invoked the authority of Plato and Socrates' daemon in order to support his views. Here is what Spinoza had to say to the poor guy:

The authority of Plato, Socrates, and Aristotle carries little weight with me. I should have been surprised if you had produced Epicurus, Democritus, Lucretius or one of the Atomists or defenders of the Atoms. It is not surprising that those who have thought up occult qualities, intentional species, substantial forms and a thousand more bits of nonsense should have devised specters and ghosts, and given credence to old wives' tales (Letter 56).

The passages above, taken together with Spinoza's strict nominalism and the surprising absence of Plato's work from Spinoza's quite extensive library, seem to attest to Spinoza's rather minute appreciation of Plato and his followers.

Both Ayers and Sarah Hutton, who responds to his essay, suggest (rightly, I believe) that Spinoza has much more in common with Neoplatonic philosophy than with Plato (80). The two major Neoplatonic elements Ayers identifies in Spinoza are emanation and the anima mundi. While I agree with Ayers about the similarities between Spinoza's 'idea Dei' and the Neoplatonic soul of the world (67), the story gets a bit more complex, since a very similar notion, that of the Agent Intellect, is also to be found in Islamic and Jewish medieval Aristotelianism. Osn several occasions (in parts II and V of the Ethics), Spinoza refers to the idea of God (or, what is the same, the infinite intellect) in a language that clearly alludes to the Agent Intellect.

Ayers' view of the flow of modes from God's nature as a relation of emanation (63-4) is, to my mind, just on target. The important commonality between Spinoza's substance-mode relation and Neoplatonic emanation is the fact that both combine the relations of causality and inherence. Indeed, in one of his late letters, Spinoza seems perfectly content to describe the flow of modes as "emanation from the necessity of the divine nature" (Letter 75).

While Ayers concludes by claiming that "within the self-consciously Platonic shell of [Spinoza's] philosophy lies a message that subverts virtually everything that traditional Platonism stood for" (78), Sarah Hutton's response to Ayers' essay attempts to stress the importance of Neoplatonic, and particularly Kabbalistic, influence on Spinoza's thought. Ayers, pointing out the mystical and mythical character of Kabbalistic thought, finds it hardly credible that it could exert a significant influence on Spinoza (9). This is not the place to discuss the issue at length, but despite Ayers' justified skepticism (and even despite Spinoza's open mockery of some doctrines of the Kabbalists [TTP Ch. 9]), I suspect that Hutton is right for two reasons. First, we should acknowledge the variety of opposite streams within the Kabbalah, with various degrees of adherence to Neoplatonic thought, and, second, there are several important passages in Spinoza's corpus which are hard to explain other than in the context of (arguing with) Kabbalistic doctrines (some of these passages are discussed in the existing literature, others, not yet).

Both Ayers and Hutton see significant similarities between Spinoza's and Platonic epistemology. According to Ayers, "for Spinoza, as, I suppose, for Plato, … apprehension of the ultimate nature of being is not beyond human reason, but is simply the highest exercise of human reason" (71), and according to Hutton, the positive role Spinoza assigns to sense knowledge is in accord with the Platonic ascent from the knowledge of finite things to the divine (86). Here, I think, we are missing one of the most surprising and bold moves of Spinoza's philosophy. First, for Spinoza, knowledge of God's essence ("the ultimate nature of being") is not only not beyond human reason but is in fact the easiest and most trivial thing one grasps. In fact, it is a knowledge one cannot fail to have (see E2p47s: "God's essence and his eternity are known to all"), the reason being that it is only the knowledge of the ultimate cause of all things that does not require any prior knowledge (see E2p45 and E2p47 and the role of E1a4 in their demonstrations). Second, the Platonic epistemological ladder -- as presented by Diotima in the Symposium -- from the knowledge of the finite to the knowledge of the infinite, is, I believe, the target of Spinoza's fascinating critique of his predecessors' convention regarding the "proper order of philosophizing" in E2p10s, but in order to address this issue properly, we had best move to the last two essays in the collection.

Robert Adams' fascinating essay, "The Priority of the Perfect in the Philosophical Theology of the Continental Rationalists," focuses on what he considers to be a main theme of the Platonic tradition, the thesis "that all things are to be understood in terms of their relation to the more perfect" (91). According to Adams, this 'top-down' strategy of understanding the less-perfect in terms of the more (and ultimately, most) perfect is a "persistent feature of the philosophical theologies of major philosophers on the European Continent in the early modern period" (92). Relying on some very interesting passages in Descartes' correspondence, Adams breaks ground in clarifying Descartes' claim that our idea of the infinite cannot be explained as a bottom-up construct (through amplification or negation) from our ideas of finite things (94-6). Yet, Adams cautions that in Descartes one cannot find "a general theory of the derivability of the constitutive properties of finite things from those of infinite things" (96), since some of the perfections of finite things (those related to extension), are to be found in God only eminently and not formally. In Spinoza, one does find such a general 'top-down' theory. Modes are conceived through substance and attributes (E1d5); all things are conceived through their cause (E1a4), and ultimately, through their first cause. Linguistically, I think it might be more secure to speak of the "Priority of the Infinite," rather than that of "the Perfect," in Spinoza, since in some places Spinoza seems to claim that "perfection" is a mere construct of the human intellect (or even imagination), and that, in themselves, all things are equally perfect; but the philosophical point is, I think, well taken (a clarification of Spinoza's understanding of perfection is still a desideratum).

The bulk of Adams' essay is dedicated to a careful examination of Leibniz's conception of God as the ens perfectissimum, the most perfect being, and the subject of all perfections. A 'perfection,' according to Leibniz, is a simple, positive quality "that expresses without any limits whatever it expresses" (105). According to Adams' helpful elucidation,

Leibniz seems in fact to have believed that all the simple predicates, of which all other predicates are ultimately composed, are among the attributes of God … . On this view, the less than perfect qualities of finite things must all be composed, by logical operations including various degrees of limitation or partial negation, from the simple perfections of God (106).

Hence, for example, the potency and knowledge of finite things should be construed as limitations of the divine perfections of omnipotence and omniscience. In this context, Adams raises an intriguing problem. What does Leibniz mean by saying that the qualities of finite things are limitations of God's perfections? According to Adams, limitation is a "partial negation." Yet, Adams contends, it is not clear how the divine perfections can be partly negated. "How can an absolutely simple property be partly denied of anything? What part of it is to be denied, and what part affirmed, given that it has no parts at all?" (107). Following a careful and detailed examination of possible attempts to rescue this doctrine, Adams seems to find the objection a fatal blow to the Leibnizian project of constructing finite qualities from divine perfections. I am not sure that it is. 'Part' is a notoriously ambiguous term, and it is not at all clear that a "partial negation" of the divine perfections truly compromises their simplicity. It is at least possible that we are talking here about different senses of 'parthood.' Here is one consideration that might support this suspicion. Let us distinguish between qualities that one can either have fully or not at all (call them "Binary Qualities"), and qualities which come in various degrees ("Non-Binary Qualities"). Being a prime, or a transcendental, number are examples of binary qualities (a number cannot be transcendental to a degree); being powerful or good are examples of non-binary qualities (one can be more or less good, more or less powerful, etc.). In his objection against Leibniz, Adams seems to assume that non-binary qualities cannot be simple. But what is the nature of the quality 'simple' itself? It seems to be perfectly legitimate to conceive of things as more or less complex or simple (a body made up of two parts is more simple than one made of seventeen). Hence, 'simple' is, I think, a non-binary quality, and if we consider all non-binary qualities as non-simple, it would seem that 'simple' is not-simple, and thus cannot be one of the perfections of God. But if God is not simple, why should we insist that his qualities must be simple?

Adams' superb essay is followed by a response by Maria Rosa Antognazza which contains several deep and important observations. According to Antognazza, "Spinoza best succeeded in providing a general 'top-down' theory" (127), and I concur with this judgment for reasons I will clarify shortly. Antognazza also makes an important suggestion in arguing that the main motivation behind the 'top-down' attitude is the attempt to avoid the danger of anthropomorphism (or, in her own words, "anthropologism" [118]). In this context, Spinoza's strict adherence to the 'top-down' attitude should not surprise us since he was much more critical of anthropomorphism than Leibniz. (Consider Leibniz's claims at the very end of the Discourse on Metaphysics (§36): "It is because of this that God humanizes himself, that he is willing to allow anthropomorphism, and that he enters into society with us as a prince with his subjects.").

"Philosophy can arrive at the concept of God but cannot start from it" claims Antognazza (122), who carefully traces the theological path "which does not start from God but finds God at the end" through the writings of Augustine, Anselm, Aquinas, and Kant (123). Qualifying this path as "Platonic," Antognazza admits that in it "there is no epistemological priority of the perfect and of the infinite, in the sense that our perception of them is not prior to that of the finite" (123-4). Indeed, the Platonic ascent from knowledge of beautiful bodies, through knowledge of beauty in the soul and the sciences, culminating in contemplation of "the very soul of the beauty … which neither flowers nor fades" (Symposium, 210-211), follows the route which ends with the perfect; but it could also be otherwise. Arguably, philosophy can start from the concept of God.

In one of his boldest moves (and Spinoza's philosophical temper was never too mild), Spinoza criticizes his predecessors who

did not observe the [proper] order of Philosophizing. For they believed that the divine nature, which they should have contemplated before all else (because it is prior both in knowledge and in nature), is last in the order of knowledge, and that the things that are called objects of the senses are prior to all. That is why, when they contemplated natural things, they thought of nothing less than they did of the divine nature; and when afterwards they directed their minds to contemplating the divine nature, they could think of nothing less than of their first fictions, on which they had built the knowledge of natural things, because these could not assist knowledge of the divine nature. (E2p10s)

One may debate the precise target of this criticism, but as far as I can see, it is clear that this criticism is at least applicable to the Platonic path of epistemological ascent. If you begin with the beauty of Callias, you will end up with the purified beauty of Callias, which (at least for Spinoza) is still all too human. If you arrive at God at the end of the process you are likely to have a conception of God cast in the image of the things with which you began your journey. That is, I think, the meaning of Spinoza's claim that "when afterwards they directed their minds to contemplating the divine nature, they could think of nothing less than of their first fictions." Furthermore, for Spinoza, the Platonic path does not allow us to know finite things, since all things are to be known through their causes. Hence, one must begin with the knowledge of the infinite, the cause of all things, before turning to the knowledge of finite things ("when they contemplated natural things, they thought of nothing less than they did of the divine nature"). One might be tempted here to suggest that, for Spinoza, the infinite "is prior in knowledge to the finite" only in the sense that the knowledge of the finite is in some way or another dependent on knowledge of the infinite, and perhaps suggest that "the order of discovery" should still begin with the finite. But I see nothing in the text to support this attempt to make Spinoza a common-sense philosopher in spite of himself. Spinoza explicitly speaks here about the "order of philosophizing," the order one should pursue in studying philosophy. Furthermore, Spinoza has the resources to motivate the claim that the actual study (or, if you wish, "order of discovery") must begin with God. Recall that for Spinoza, "God's essence is known to all" (E2p47s). Insofar as the essence of God is self-caused, it does not presuppose or require the knowledge of anything else, and hence it is the easiest thing to know. The extent of Spinoza's epistemological revolution becomes clear once we realize that the Third Kind of Knowledge, the most austere kind of knowledge for Spinoza and the most difficult to attain, is nothing but adequate knowledge of the nature of … finite things. It is a knowledge which begins from the adequate idea of the formal essence of one of the attributes and then traces its causal path till it reaches the essence of a finite thing (E2p40s2). This process does not provide us with knowledge of the essence of God (which, in fact, we always had), but rather with knowledge of the finite (me, you, and the hippos in the zoo).

When we ask ourselves now: "Is it indeed a common feature of the early modern rationalists that they pursued a Platonic 'top-down' agenda of understanding the finite in terms of the infinite?", it seems that, at least for Spinoza, the question is ill-formulated, for it was not the rationalists, but Plato himself, who stands accused of failing to understand the finite in terms of the infinite, and by this, clearing the way for the spread of anthropomorphism.[3]

[1] In references to Spinoza's works I have used Shirley's translation of the Letters, and Curley's translation of the other works. Passages in the Ethics are referred to by means of the following abbreviations: a(-xiom), c(-orollary), p(-roposition), s(-cholium) and app(-endix). For translations of Descartes, I have relied on Cottingham, Stoothoff, and Murdoch (The Philosophical Writing of Descartes), and translations of Leibniz are from Garber and Ariew (Leibniz, Philosophical Essays).

[2] I am indebted to Oded Schechter for the last point.

[3] I am greatly indebted to Michael Della Rocca, Zach Gartenberg, and Alan Nelson, for their helpful comments on a previous version of this review essay.