Rationality and Logic

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Robert Hanna, Rationality and Logic, MIT Press, 2006, 316pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0262083493.

Reviewed by Gila Sher, University of California, San Diego


In this rich and ambitious book Robert Hanna develops a broadly Kantian "cognitivist" conception of logic according to which logic is an apriori normative discipline, constitutive of rationality, and constructively created by rational animals based on an innate template, called protologic, which belongs to a special cognitive faculty, the logic faculty. The study of this faculty and the logic it generates is a common project of cognitive psychology and philosophy, but it is not a naturalistic project in the usual sense of the word.

In the first three chapters Hanna justifies his logical cognitivism on metalogical philosophical grounds. In the next two chapters he offers empirical psychological justification for his conception. And in the last two chapters he uses his conception to develop an account of (i) the nature of logical knowledge, and (ii) the normativity of logic, which, in turn, are also used to further justify the conception.

Before turning to the specific chapters, however, let me briefly describe three basic elements of Hanna's conception: the logic faculty, the protologic, and the psychological yet nonnaturalistic nature of the project.

The Logic Faculty. The logic faculty is part of the cognitive architecture of rational animals, and is presupposed by the language faculty. It is a cognitive faculty dedicated to the representation of logic, as well as to the construction, analysis, and evaluation of any possible logical system. It contains the protologic and has the capacity for logical intuition. The existence of a logic faculty explains and justifies our capacity for logical reasoning and the existence of logical systems. The idea of the logic faculty has its roots in (i) the Kantian and Boolean idea "that logic is the a priori science of the 'laws of thought'", (ii) "the mid-twentieth-century idea [which Hanna attributes to Quine], that logic has a universal, indispensable, and unrevisable basis", and (iii) "the contemporary idea, drawn from Chomsky… and Fodor… , that the human animal carries out all its specifically rational cognitive activities in a fully meaningful inner language or 'language of thought'" (25-6).

Protologic. The protologic is a fixed set of universal, innate, a priori, unrevisable, consciously accessible, and categorically obligatory logical concepts and principles. These concepts and principles underlie all deductive reasoning, are "used for the construction, analysis, and evaluation of every logical system, be it classical or nonclassical" (202), and presupposed, both constructionally and epistemically, by any act of reasoning and any logical system. The concepts and principles of the protologic Hanna characterizes as higher-order or schematic, and as being "weak version[s] of … basic principle[s] of classical logic" (45). The discovery or determination of these principles is a joint project of cognitive psychologists and logicians. A few examples for what such principles might be are: "An argument is valid if it is impossible for all of its premises to be true and its conclusion false", "Not every sentence is both true and false", "A sentence is logically true if it comes out true under every possible uniform reinterpretation of its nonlogical constants", and "A proof from a set of premises to a conclusion is valid if the corresponding classical conditional of its underlying argument is logically true" (ibid.). The protologic is modeled after Chomsky's UG. It constitutes the minimal core of logical rules that every rational animal must obey, but is developed in different ways in different rational beings into different "logics of thought", and is used by different logicians to construct different logical systems, whose common core it constitutes.

A psychological yet Nonnaturalistic Conception of Logic. Logical cognitivism says both (i) that there is an essential connection between the logical and the psychological, and (ii) that logic is not explanatorily reducible to empirical psychology. The latter claim is an antipsychologistic, and more generally an antinaturalistic claim, in the Quinean or "scientific" sense of naturalism. Hanna justifies this claim by a general argument against scientific naturalism, one of the main points of which, as it applies to the protologic, is that the modal status of empirical laws is too weak to allow them to account for the laws of protologic (in the strong explanatory sense required by scientific naturalism).

Hanna does not offer a decisive argument for his theory. "[T]he logic faculty thesis", he concedes, "is not likely to be demonstrated decisively by any single line of argument… . Nevertheless, [this] … is consistent with the possibility that the logical faculty thesis be demonstrable by the combined force of several different but interlocking lines of argument… . So my general strategy will be to develop a five-pronged cumulative argument for the logic faculty thesis." (47) This five-pronged argument is presented in Chapters 1-5.

Chapters 1-3 present a three-pronged abductive argument for logical cognitivism which says that this doctrine "both coherently and also apparently uniquely solves" (77) three outstanding problems in the philosophy of logic: (i) the problem of psychologism, (ii) the e pluribus unum problem, and (iii) the logocentric predicament. The problem of psychologism requires a clarification of logic's relation to psychology, the e pluribus unum problem requires a reconciliation of "the unity of logic with the plurality of logical systems distinct from classical or elementary logic" (xx), and the logocentric predicament requires us to contend with the "fact that in order to explain any logical theory, or justify any deduction, logic is presupposed and used -- so logic appears to be both inexplicable and unjustified" (xxi).

Chapters 4-5 present a series of arguments to the effect that logical cognitivism is compatible with, supported by, and improves upon (i) the "standard cognitivist model of the mind" (ibid.) (Chomsky, Fodor, and others), and (ii) recent work on "the psychology of human reasoning" (ibid.) (Johnson-Laird, Kahneman and Tversky, Cherniak, and others).

In Chapter 6 Hanna presents an outline of a theory of logical intuition, arrived at by an intellectual dialogue with Wittgenstein, Kripke, and Benacerraf. Intuition is, for Hanna, a mental act, involves semantic content, and is clear and distinct, authoritative, cognitively indispensable, yet fallible. Knowledge based on intuition is a priori, necessary, and non-inferential. Logical intuition is not analogous to sense perception, but to "memory, imagination, or conceptual understanding", none of which requires "an efficacious causal link, involving direct physical contact, between the object cognized and the cognizer" (186).

In Chapter 7 Hanna argues for the normativity of logic, comparing the principles of protologic to "categorical imperatives" in Kant's sense. "The central claim is that logic is a moral or 'prescriptive' science and not merely a factual or 'descriptive' one" (xxii). One of the things this explains is the frequency of errors in logical reasoning. Normativity requires freedom, Hanna points out, including freedom to obey or not obey the logical principles.

This is a very incomplete summary of Hanna's rich and complex book, a summary which, I hope, will whet the reader's appetite to read the book. But a book of this kind -- original, unconventional, full of arguments and syntheses, and drawing from a wide array of sources -- is also unavoidably open to a great many questions and criticisms. These are questions and criticisms that, in my experience, excite further interest in, and thought on, the book, rather than draw one away from it, but they are questions and criticisms all the same.

Let me end, then, with a few critical questions (largely, but not exclusively, directed at the metalogical and philosophical parts of Rationality and Logic) that I, for one, would like to pose to Hanna.

1. The e pluribus unum problem: Hanna's solution to the problem of the unity vs. the plurality of logic is to posit a single protologic which is used to construct a multiplicity of logical systems, all in accordance with its "core" principles. The crucial point is that the protologic is a minimal collection of concepts and principles included in, or presupposed by, all logics, but not identical with any.

One difficulty with this solution is that it leaves us with insufficient critical tools for adjudicating between incompatible or competing logics. So long as the minimal requirements are satisfied, anything goes, so it seems. But granted that there is room for a multiplicity of logics, this does not mean that any system whatsoever that satisfies the minimal requirements is a correct or acceptable logic. Unless, of course, the minimal principles are very strong, in which case the plurality of logics is threatened. Take, for example, the principle that logical consequence is necessary. If "necessary" is a very liberal concept, the need for critical tools to curb the multiplicity of proposed (and proposable) logics is not satisfied, but if "necessary" is carefully configured so it allows only the "right" or "acceptable" logics, then the protological solution is no better than a direct adjudication between competing logics.

2. The logocentric predicament: The logocentric predicament is the predicament of circularity, i.e., of having to use logic in order to explain or justify logic. Hanna claims that all attempts to prove the unreality of this predicament fail, and the only remaining solution is the logical cognitivist solution which affirms the predicament and its conclusion, "the groundedlessness of logic" (69), while taking away its sting.

But there is a well-known solution to the logocentric predicament, a solution that Hanna acknowledges but curiously does not address. This, of course, is the holistic solution. The logocentric predicament, as Hanna acknowledges, depends on the assumption "that epistemic noncircularity is a necessary condition of all legitimate explanations and justifications" (55). But, he points out, this assumption, hence the reality of the predicament, is challenged by holism. One would expect him at this point to contend with this solution, but he doesn't. That can be just an unintended oversight. Hanna attributes the holistic solution to Dummett, and says that since Dummett himself ended up rejecting holism, there is no need to consider this solution. (68) But of course, this solution is there independently of Dummett, and it constitutes an alternative to the logical cognitivist solution.

3. The protologic-UG analogy: According to Hanna, "the protologic stands to the many classical or elementary, extended, and deviant logics, precisely as Chomsky's UG stands to the many native, idiolective or dialectic, and foreign natural languages" (48). But granted that useful analogies are generally partial, there are substantive differences between natural languages and logical systems that throw doubt on the appropriateness of this analogy. For example: (i) while natural languages are natural constructions, logical systems are artificial constructions, (ii) while natural languages are not theoretical (not designed for theoretical purposes), logical systems are theoretical (are often designed specifically, or to a large extent, for theoretical purposes), and (iii) while natural languages are not truth-constrained (i.e., are not constrained by a "truth" requirement) logical systems are truth-constrained (in the sense that a logical system that includes a false or a modally weak "logical truth", or that sanctions an incorrect "logical inference", is unacceptable). Hanna acknowledges one significant difference between the protologic and the UG: namely, the protological principles are consciously accessible, while those of the UG need not be, but I am not sure this suffices to close the gap. I cannot elaborate further here, but I think that the idea of innate principles that determine what is permitted in a logical system is more complicated and problematic than that of innate principles determining what is permitted in natural languages, hence requires a special justification.

4. The content of the protologic, and the joint logical-psychological project: The content of the protologic is supposed to be jointly determined by psychologists and logicians. But if the psychologists seek innate principles of "natural" logic and the logicians (or philosophers of logic) seek core principles of "systematic" or "theoretical" logic, it is not clear that they will reach the same principles. Logical theory has gone a long way from natural logic, and can in principle go even further, and it is not clear that it is bound by all the core principles of natural logic, or that natural logic is bound by all the core principles of theoretical logic. Indeed even if you find a common denominator of natural logic and all the current theoretical logics, tomorrow theoretical considerations may justify yet a new logical system that will not respect the earlier "common denominator", and for a good reason. This is not to say that either one of these projects is not important or that there are no significant relations between natural and theoretical logic, but that the principles which determine what is "permitted" in "natural logic" may not coincide with those determining what is permitted in theoretical logic.

5. The objectivity and normativity of logic: In considering the way a given branch of knowledge or science X is grounded, or its nature is explained, we have three basic options: (i) X is grounded in, or explained in terms of, both reality and the mind, (ii) X is grounded in, or explained in terms of, reality but not the mind, and (iii) X is grounded in, or explained in terms of, the mind but not reality. Now for most branches of knowledge we would choose the first option, but for logic philosophers have traditionally chosen the last option. Hanna follows this tradition: "[I]f the logic faculty thesis [is] true, … logic does not require an external (nonlogical) and objective (nonmental) ground of explanation and justification: rather, it requires only an internal and mentalistic ground, that is, a logico-psychological ground. Logic is both globally explained and globally justified by the fact that rational animals possess a logic faculty… . In other words, logic is globally explained and globally justified by our cognitive constitution. The explanatory and justificatory buck for logic stops right at the fundamental cognitive architecture of our rational human nature." (74) It seems to me that someone who, like Hanna, consciously attempts to open up the question "What is the nature of logic?" in a way that is free from traditional prejudices, and who justifies his own answer as an "apparently unique solution" to a cluster of problems associated with this question, ought to consider the two other options as well. Hanna considers, and rightly rejects, the second option, but he does not consider the first.

Hanna seems to assume that any attempt to ground logic in reality must lead to Platonism. But this assumption itself assumes a foundationalist approach to the grounding and explanation of logic. As we have indicated above, however, the latter assumption is not necessary. If we take a holistic rather than a foundationalist approach to knowledge, there is no unbridgeable gap between reality and the mind -- indeed, no unbridgeable gap between the abstract and the concrete -- hence, no danger of Platonism. Hanna's goal, to ensure that "logic … is not platonic or metaphysically alienated from human cognition" (52), is thus perfectly compatible with logic having a double grounding, both in the mind and in the world, and Hanna's work can be viewed as a contribution to such a dual account, centering on the former.   

Finally, if we allow that logic is grounded in reality in addition to the mind, we add another dimension, or another option, to our understanding of the normativity of logic. Logic, in that case, derives its normativity (partly, yet significantly) from its truth, like any other science. We are normatively bound to accept as physical laws statements that (as far as we know) are factually correct and nomologically necessary, and eschew those that (as far as we know) are not. And the same holds for logic. We are normatively bound to accept as logical laws statements that (as far as we know) are factually correct and formally necessary, and eschew the rest. Hanna says that logic is "objectively real via language", which is itself "objectively and really" contained in the world (158). But this is not enough, since in the dual grounding of knowledge in both mind and the world, language falls on the side of the (admittedly real) mind, which (in the present context) is contrasted with the world.

These are some issues that I think Hanna should address. But while Rationality and Logic (understandably) does not address all the relevant issues, it is an admirable and promising attempt to confront the question of the nature of logic and its relation to rationality in a substantive and open-minded manner, without excessive reliance on intuition or gut feeling, without hand waving, without begging questions, and in a creative and intellectually stimulating way. This book is highly recommended to philosophers, logicians, and cognitive psychologists. [1]


[1] I wish to thank Cory Wright for a helpful discussion.